Stoic Warriors: The Ancient Philosophy behind the Military Mind

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Nancy Sherman, Stoic Warriors: The Ancient Philosophy behind the Military Mind, Oxford University Press, 2005, 256pp, $26.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195152166.

Reviewed by Christopher Toner, Air University


Nancy Sherman notes at the outset that the idea of "being stoic" resonates with military officers, but notes also that there are severe costs to being Stoic in a rigorous, orthodox fashion. Interweaving an investigation of topics in Stoic philosophy with an exploration of "the military mind" and its ways of dealing with the rigors of military life and combat, she argues that a modified or "gentle Stoicism" provides the psychological and moral outlook suitable for the military, and in many ways for the rest of us as well. This view, culled largely from the Roman Stoics, still stresses and seeks to empower autonomous rational agency, while acknowledging human limits and human sociability in ways alien to some of the more rigorous Greek Stoics -- indeed in ways that frequently invoke Aristotle. So much is this the case, in fact, that I will finally ask how Stoic Sherman's warriors will really be: might they instead be, in a phrase no publisher would accept in the title of a book, Peripatetic Warriors?

Before asking this question, of course, I should examine Sherman's treatment of the broadly if pre-philosophically stoic nature of the military mind, and how she thinks it could profit by becoming in some respects more, and in others less, Stoic. As the book is a (successful, I think) attempt to write for at least three audiences -- philosophers, military officers, and a wider morally reflective public -- she begins with an overview of Stoic moral thought (their notions of happiness, self-control and the emotions, choosing goods as contrasted with selecting indifferents) and an introduction to her key sources: Cicero, Seneca, Epictetus, and Marcus Aurelius. She focuses on the Romans because we have their complete texts, and because they took it as their object to present a publicly accessible and practical philosophy. Her broaching the topic of the bearing of Stoic philosophy on military life with the story of Admiral James Stockdale's reliance on Epictetus as a prisoner of war in Vietnam is typical of her approach in this book, and it is effective: Stoicism is not merely a theory, but can powerfully inform a practical outlook on life and can guide and strengthen vulnerable human beings facing extreme hardships and the violent emotions attendant upon them.

The second chapter contrasts current obsessions with physical fitness (taken to dangerous extremes by some body builders) with Stoic indifference to the body -- the body is external to happiness, and is to be regarded as a tool, to be kept in good condition, to be sure, but not valued for its own sake. Here the resonance with a military outlook is clear: physical fitness is a duty because of its role in mission readiness, and further, given the high risks to which the body is subjected, one can see some appeal in regarding it as a preferred indifferent. Yet Sherman pulls back: Drawing on anecdotes of soldiers who have lost limbs or suffered other disfiguring injuries, she argues that while Stoicism has much to offer in service of recovering or at least adapting, we should be prepared to admit, as even the most stoic of the veterans do, that such injuries can indeed affect our happiness and even our sense of identity.

Sherman then turns to the role of decorum in instilling military bearing of the sort that can maintain good order and discipline even in combat conditions, largely defending the military's use of manners to instill morals, if I may so put it. In doing so, Sherman draws on Cicero's notion of decorum being indexed to our roles or personae (noting that this notion usefully allows us to separate the deferential respect due to rank and based on one's professional role, from the dignitary respect due to all and based on our shared, and most fundamental, role as rational agents), and Seneca's account of how decorum and emotional demeanor can help "weave the fabric of community." The decorum insisted upon by the military, focusing on stolid determination, respect and obedience, and camaraderie and friendship between soldiers, can cement the bonds within military units (bonds shown in many studies to be essential to combat effectiveness); the approach to decorum taken by enlightened commanders can be enriched by familiarity with Stoic treatments of the subject. It is in this chapter that we find the most direct and unmixed recommendation of Stoic views; the remaining chapters deal largely with emotion in Stoic theory and in the life of the warrior, and while Sherman certainly finds much of value in the former, she repeatedly softens or even controverts key Stoic claims, often leaning in the direction of Aristotle.

Her first topic is anger, and she begins by noting the Stoic view that apatheia must replace anger, which is both destructive and a sign of vulnerability. Following an interesting discussion of how mock anger can be more effective than real anger in military training and inculturation (in Boot Camp, e.g.), she turns to Seneca's famous treatment of anger and its role in frenzy and cruelty in De Ira. But while she endorses some of his warnings about anger, she insists that some forms of anger, such as righteous indignation, can, as protests of moral violations and expressions of commitment to value, be healthy and just. This she illustrates with two stories. The first is that of Hugh Thomson at My Lai: the Army warrant officer, acting in part from a sense of moral outrage, had his crew train their guns on involved American soldiers and was able to prevent part of that day's massacre. The second, perhaps of particular interest to philosophers, is that of John Rawls's experience of anger during the Second World War, an anger directed not at civilians or even at foot soldiers, but at the Japanese leaders. Sherman concludes that while the Stoics are certainly right that anger cannot simply be given free reign, neither should (or can) it be simply eliminated or even repressed and compartmentalized. The emotions will find expression in some form, and we should work toward ensuring that that form is rational. As Aristotle said, in a passage Sherman cites in this chapter, we must be angry in the right way with the right people for the right reasons.

Sherman turns next to another emotion prominent in war: fear. The rigorous Stoic view is that all fear is irrational because it treats external dangers to life and limb as genuine evils that can affect our happiness. Sherman rejects this view -- "the unacceptable face of orthodox Stoicism" -- because it alienates us from our humanity in the sense that it regards our commitments to bodily integrity and to family and friends, all things that can be lost suddenly and terribly in war, as indifferents. Fear of such things is natural and just -- so also is the fear of killing others (surely we do not want to eradicate this entirely even in soldiers). But drawing on Seneca and Cicero she proposes that a moderate Stoicism can brace us for tragedy and help us recover from it without compromising our humanity. Of particular interest here is her suggestion that soldiers need become adept at "role switching," between their professional role as warrior and their more fundamental role as human beings, a role they should be always ready to bring back to the fore. Sherman closes with a discussion of how some Stoic ideals, such as a resumed sense of empowered agency, have proven effective in recovering from post-traumatic stress disorder.

The last two chapters, on grief and camaraderie, both focus on the importance of solidarity in military life, and play out largely in the pattern we have seen so far: the orthodox Stoic claims are stated, rejected as too strong (Sherman notes a tension between the Stoic conception of agents as both self-sufficient and as social beings), and a modified position with recognizably Stoic features advanced in their place. In softening the Stoic view that grief, as an expression of distress and vulnerability, is to be eliminated, Sherman draws on Seneca's and Cicero's writing on grieving with proper decorum, and interestingly links their ideas to traditional forms of military grieving, such as military funeral services and war memorials. Yet she seems to go further than they do, and to endorse Aristotle's idea that "the expression of certain emotions can be cathartic and a medium for enlightenment and purification." This point too, she shows, is borne out by military experience. Turning to camaraderie, she rightly notes that military life "requires a self-sufficiency that is social to the core," and allows that on "appreciating the role of friendship and the contribution of attachment emotions to psychological and moral sustenance, Aristotle and his followers simply do better": Stoics cannot admit, as they should, that friendship is essential to our self-sufficiency and well-being. Yet Sherman does insist that the Stoics outdo Aristotle on one vital form of commitment to community: the universal community of all rational agents, cemented by respect for human beings as such, whether or not we are emotionally attached to them. She connects this Stoic idea of human agents as citizens of the cosmos to Michael Walzer's idea of all combatants as moral equals participating in a hellish but still norm-governed activity, and points out that here is a lesson the military mind would do well to internalize (invoking, of course, the shameful story of Abu Ghraib). Realizing the ideal of a universal community, she concludes, "requires cultivating humanity through empathetic identification and respect," something that "should be a part of any warrior's code."

This is an impressive book, and in many ways a moving one, even a personal one (the stories related, occasionally with illustrating photographs, are powerful; some of them involve protagonists she came to know through her connection to the Naval Academy; one story relates her father's experiences as a medic during the Second World War). It offers a valuable treatment of Stoic philosophy, and of military culture, which she clearly understands and respects. Indeed readers will find here not so much groundbreaking research on Stoic texts or their interpretations as something more like a philosophy, or the core of a philosophy, of military service -- a philosophy of one of the fundamental professional roles in our culture, with implications for our most fundamental role of all, human agency. It is a practical book of philosophy -- in this too, then, Sherman follows the Roman Stoics. Still, the book does not leave us without a few points for critical notice.

Although the book is wide ranging (and I have not done justice to some of its features, such as the dialogue she opens between Stoicism and contemporary psychology), I believe it could usefully have ranged just enough further as to take up two other topics important in military life. Sexuality intermittently gets the military in trouble, and I suspect Sherman's modified Stoicism (perhaps taking Marcus Aurelius's views as a starting point) could shed some light on the subject. The other topic is religion: Sherman occasionally takes up religious themes (the religious beliefs of certain protagonists of her anecdotes, the kaddish or Jewish prayer of mourning), but I believe religion is rather more central to "the military mind" than she lets on: it is an old saying that there are no atheists in foxholes.

Finally, we have noted Sherman's reliance upon the Roman Stoics, something she herself stresses. But, does she follow them so far as to be Stoic herself? I think actually not. Her borrowings from Aristotle are not merely in service of filling in gaps in a Stoic account, but at times are in direct opposition to some quite central Stoic positions, as Sherman herself points out: "We might ultimately wish Seneca to concede a similar point: that loss of a beloved … can diminish our overall good or happiness (eudaimonia). But to concede this would undermine a cornerstone of Stoicism." Yet, as we have seen, she does concede it, e.g. in seeing friendship as actually part of happiness. It seems to me that it is Stoicism that is filling in gaps (sometimes important ones, to be sure) in an account that is fundamentally Aristotelian. Or perhaps we should say that her Stoicism is not merely unorthodox, but heretical, rejecting some quite central doctrines and occasionally following after strange gods. At the very least, Stoicism is not the (sole) ancient philosophy behind the military mind. I do not of course mean that Sherman is unaware of this, but neither do I mean here merely to quibble over words (and I am not seriously suggesting re-titling the book Peripatetic or -- heaven forbid -- Eclectic Warriors): Sherman leads us to take up the old question about how one should live, and I find it very interesting that, starting from a Stoic outlook, we continually find ourselves moving back to an Aristotelian one to get things quite right.