Stoicism: Traditions and Transformations

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Steven K. Strange and Jack Zupko (eds.), Stoicism: Traditions and Transformations, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 310pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521827094.

Reviewed by Jon Miller, Queen's University


Of all the accomplishments in the history of philosophy over the past few decades, the recovery of Stoicism would have to rank among the most impressive. From a state of relative neglect and uneven comprehension, it has become a central area of research in ancient philosophy, and widespread (though of course not universal) consensus has formed around the interpretation of its core doctrines. The health of the field is indicated by a recent shift in the direction of research. While scholars are still seeking to improve our understanding of the school itself, they have also begun to explore its external relations. Those relations are numerous and of profound significance, giving us reason to believe that careful consideration of them will greatly enhance our knowledge of Stoicism in particular and the history of philosophy in general.

The essays collected in Stoicism: Traditions and Transformations constitute a major addition to this comparative project. They can be seen as doing so on two levels: first, by examining individual points of contact between Stoicism and other figures, eras or philosophical fields from ancient times to the present; second, in the process of examining those points of contact, by shedding light on what it is to be a Stoic. Setting aside the introduction for the moment, the twelve chapters fall into four groups: ancient, medieval, early modern and contemporary. In what follows, overviews are given by group; then, a brief global comment/criticism is provided by way of conclusion.


"The Socratic Imprint on Epictetus' Philosophy" by A.A. Long is doubly appropriate as the first chapter in the volume, for not only does it deal with the earliest figure but also it is by the dean of modern Stoic scholarship. Though Epictetus was a Stoic, he borrowed more from Socrates, his preferred philosopher, than his Stoic predecessors. Long has studied some of Epictetus' debts to Socrates elsewhere; here, he treats the connections in their methodologies. Assembling extensive texts and arguments, Long convinces this reader, at least, that Socrates' elenchus was the standard for philosophical practice that Epictetus strove to emulate in his own teaching and research. When doing so, however, Epictetus adapted it to meet the demands of his system. In keeping with Stoicism's emphasis on the responsibility that each person has for the state of her or his own soul, Epictetus encouraged students to "engage in dialogue with their individual selves and to use this as their principal instrument of moral progress" (23).

The next paper in ancient, Steven K. Strange's "The Stoics on the Voluntariness of the Passions," is the only non-comparative chapter in the volume, restricting its scope to the important Stoic doctrine that our passions are up to us. However counterintuitive it might seem -- passions seem to be at least partially things which happen to us, not the object of choice -- Strange reminds us that it is well-grounded in the Stoics' moral psychology. If one thinks (as the Stoics did) that the soul is a fundamentally unified rational entity, so that all its powers and activities are to be explained in terms of the operations of reason, and if one thinks that an agent's reason is within his control, it will be quite natural for one to think that passions are within his control, too. Though the basic argument will not be unfamiliar to students of Stoicism, Strange manages some novel and extremely interesting points along the way. These include his interpretation of the Stoic analysis of akrasia (44-5) and his claim that impressions can sometimes force our assent (48).

Following Strange, Troels Engberg-Pedersen's "Stoicism in the Apostle Paul: A Philosophical Reading" wants to "show by a single example in what way it is correct to claim that Stoicism helps Paul formulate the goal of his theological thought" (55). Engberg-Pedersen focuses on Galatians 5:13-26 as his main text, arguing (among other things) that the freedom which the Christian is supposed to experience when she aligns her will to God's is directly analogous to the freedom which the Stoic enjoys when he conforms himself to the rational order of Nature. On the basis of this analysis, Engberg-Pedersen concludes that Paul is a "crypto-Stoic" (73), meaning that he was acquainted with and influenced by Stoic notions but for obvious religious reasons didn't want to admit it.

Brad Inwood's "Moral Judgment in Seneca" is next. (Full disclosure: Inwood and Normore were this reviewer's dissertation co-supervisors.) Beginning with some interesting reflections on the nature of moral judgment -- among the conclusions here are that it "has not always been taken as a bland general synonym for moral decisions and that it need not be" (76) -- Inwood proceeds to consider Seneca's contribution to the formulation of the concept. His take on the matter is nuanced. On the one hand, he doubts that "Seneca invented the idea of moral judgment": there are too many texts showing it existed prior to him (78). On the other, he doesn't think Seneca's work is entirely irrelevant: texts such as On Anger and Ep. 81 constitute "at least prima facie evidence that Seneca was self-consciously and creatively exploiting aspects of the (to him) familiar notion of a iudex [judge] as a guide to reflection on the kind of rationality appropriate to situations that call for moral decision making" (88). Though experimental and hence preliminary, Seneca provides ample resources which later thinkers would utilize to articulate less-tentative models of moral evaluation and decision making.

There is a double-entendre in the title of Richard Sorabji's "Stoic First Movements in Christianity": first, it picks up the Stoic concept of the "pre-emotion" or "first (emotional) movement" (propatheiai); second, it refers to the impact of that concept on the earliest centuries of the Christian church. In Stoicism, the pre-emotion is not a genuine emotion, because it does not involve an evaluative reaction by the agent; instead, it is the involuntary "jolt" which all humans experience upon the reception of certain powerful impressions. To use an example from Seneca, "very often even the bravest man grows pale as he puts on his armor" (On anger 2.3.3 (translated by Sorabji on 96)). As Sorabji notes, the concept of the pre-emotion allows Stoics to set aside objections to their intellectualistic theory of emotions: when their opponents contended that the brave man's pallor proves the non-cognitiveness of emotions, Stoics were able to deflect such criticisms on the grounds that such phenomena are but preludes to true emotions. After a brief analysis of the concept itself, Sorabji marshals a fascinating array of texts to show how it was received by early Christian thinkers. Though they completely changed its meaning -- in their hands, first emotions become first thoughts and specifically the first bad thoughts all of us have prior to sinning -- Sorabji thinks it would be a mistake to "condemn the misuse of the Stoic term" (106). What we should concentrate on instead is "how fruitful it can be when one group of thinkers transforms the ideas of another group, in order to set them to new purposes" (106).


Sten Ebbesen's "Where Were the Stoics in the Late Middle Ages?" marks the entry into medieval philosophy. No sooner does he state his intriguing question than he gives its answer: "everywhere and nowhere" (108). Methodologically, Ebbesen finds in late medieval philosophy a "great community of spirits with the Stoics" (125). This manifests itself in a zest for logic and conceptual analysis and an insistence on making the firm distinctions between philosophical notions that are required to formulate coherent theories of the world and our place in it. Such is not, in Ebbesen's congenial words, "a sport for gentlemen"; while "[m]ost of Western history consists of gentlemen's centuries," scholastics and Stoics enthusiastically played the rough game (108). Doctrinally, however, it seems that Stoics are nowhere. Though it is true that hints of Stoicism can be discerned in various areas of scholastic thought, none more so than scholastic logic, close scrutiny of these apparent similarities usually reveals differences on important matters of detail. Since the details matter when it comes to doctrinal affinity, Ebbesen concludes that Stoics were not important on this level.

Ebbesen's piece deliberately sets its sights wide; Calvin Normore's "Abelard's Stoicism and Its Consequences" is the exact opposite. Not only does Normore look at a single person but also he zooms in on "just one theme in Abelard's ethics": his analysis of the specific location of responsibility (132). In contrast to many of his contemporaries, Abelard denies that "the moral character of an act is an intrinsic feature of the particular act itself" (133). Neither does he think that "the moral significance of an act [can] derive solely from … the voluntas from which it is done either" (132). Instead of the act or the will, Abelard makes "consent or intention the locus of moral responsibility" (141). As Normore understands them, Abelard's notion of consent or intention is conceptually equivalent to the Stoics' notion of assent. And just as Abelard identifies consent or intention as the bearer of all moral responsibility, so the Stoics did for assent. In Normore's opinion, the isomorphism between Abelard and the Stoics is no accident. For in Normore's opinion, Abelard is "deeply influenced by Stoic doctrine and is self-consciously taking up Stoic themes in his ethics" (143). Normore concludes by arguing that "it is in virtue of Abelard's taking up [Stoic] themes that they remain part of the philosophical landscape in the later Middle Ages" (143).

Early modern

Whether in virtue of Abelard or someone else, Stoicism had become a dominant presence in philosophy by the dawn of the early modern era. As one would expect, though, the Stoicism of c.1600 was substantially different from classical Stoicism, which is a key reason historians tend to call it "Neostoicism." In "Constancy and Coherence," Jacqueline Lagrée tackles the job of determining "what specific effects Neostoicism had in the moral sphere" of that time (149). To organize her inquiry, she probes how a central principle of Stoic ethics -- which she calls "constancy" -- resurfaced in early modern thought. As Lagrée conceives of it, constancy is "less a particular virtue than something that colors all of the virtues … [it is] a firm and stable disposition that results from [the soul's] agreement with nature" (150). Going through a number of important figures, including Lipsius, du Vair and others, Lagrée demonstrates both that constancy was of critical importance to their moral theories and that it became increasingly less Stoic (and more Christian) as time progressed. The dissolution of the specifically Stoic aspects of constancy reflects a broader trend in early modern thought. As Lagrée writes in her conclusion, "[a]fter the death of Lipsius and especially with the advent of the new and influential philosophical system of Descartes, modern stoicism ceases to be a true philosophy and becomes instead an ethical and then legal attitude" (168).

Like Lagrée, Donald Rutherford is also interested in "the fate of Stoic ethics in the early modern period" (178). In "On the Happy Life: Descartes vis-ˆ-vis Seneca," he contrasts the two thinkers' conceptions of happiness. Rutherford takes pains to emphasize a "striking commonality of purpose": both take the "attainment of happiness" to be their "principal goal," and both think that philosophy "teaches us how to live happily" (193). Without discounting this basic agreement -- indeed, it is more important to him than anything else -- Rutherford does raise some compelling differences. Most importantly, Rutherford argues that unlike Seneca's, Descartes' ethics is not eudaimonistic. Stoics such as Seneca think "the aim of ethical inquiry is to articulate the content of happiness, which is identified as our supreme good and final end" (182). Not so, Descartes. According to Rutherford, he disengages "the notion of happiness from that of the supreme good" and thereby "lays the foundations of a theory that is distinct" from Stoicism (182). Descartes conceived of happiness as an affective state -- the satisfaction of mind that results from the possession of the supreme good. As such, it is distinct from the supreme good per se, which is virtue and virtue alone. The final end can be either of these, "for the supreme good is undoubtedly the thing we ought to set ourselves as the good of all our actions, and the resulting contentment of mind is also rightly called our end, since it is the attraction which makes us seek the supreme good" (181).

While Descartes' affinities with Stoicism have only recently been emphasized, scholars have long been impressed by the resemblance of Stoicism to Spinoza's philosophy. It is somewhat ironic, then, that the Spinoza of Firmin DeBrabander's "Psychotherapy and Moral Perfection: Spinoza and the Stoics on the Prospect of Happiness" appears much less Stoical than Rutherford's Descartes. According to DeBrabander, Stoics and Spinoza agree on the objective of life, which is the conformity of the self to nature and the reigning in of those parts of the self which go beyond nature. However, DeBrabander thinks that Spinoza, for reasons which are at bottom naturalistic, disagreed with Stoics over the feasibility of this objective. Stoics thought humans are capable of attaining complete control over their thoughts and actions and with that control came the possibility of complete happiness. Spinoza had little patience with this: in his view, the parameters of human control are narrowly fixed by the overwhelming natural forces enveloping them. Given such impotence, the perfectionism which Stoic psychotheraphy tries to achieve is beyond any human's ability; instead, "there is in the end a tragic element to Spinozistic ethics, since I am necessarily driven to an end that is futile" (211).


In "Duties of Justice, Duties of Material Aid: Cicero's Problematic Legacy," Martha Nussbaum traces the hidden yet overwhelming influence exerted by Cicero's De officiis on Western views of international obligations. As her title suggests, central to this influence is a distinction Cicero makes between two types of duties: described in the broadest of terms, duties of justice are based on "an idea of respect for humanity, of treating a human being like an end rather than a means" (220), while duties of material aid derive from "the various degrees of association, beginning with the species as a whole, and the ties of reason and speech that link us all together" (223). Corresponding to the different sources of the two types of duties is an important difference in the kind of obligation they place on us. Just as the recognition of humanity is unequivocal and uniform across agents, so "[d]uties of justice are fully universal, and impose strict, exceptionless obligations" (222). And just as degrees of association are greater-or-less -- my association with my family is greater than my association with someone I've never met in a country I've never heard of -- so "a great deal of latitude" is attached to duties of material aid (224). Nussbaum argues that this distinction has been adopted by many in the history of the West -- she singles out Aquinas, Grotius and Kant as important examples -- and it is at least partially responsible for the dismal material inequalities which exist among present-day nation states. To make matters worse, she contends that it is ultimately untenable, and she devotes the bulk of her article to uncovering the problems.

The final chapter, "Stoic emotion" by Lawrence Becker, is more positive. Continuing the attempt to rehabilitate Stoic ethics that he began in his 1998 A New Stoicism, Becker here attempts to clear a main hurdle facing that project: namely, "the idea that there is something deeply wrong, and perhaps even psychologically impossible, about the kind of emotional life that Stoics recommend" (250). As he did in his book, Becker distinguishes between what Stoics have actually said about the issue versus what they ought to say. While it is true that "some ancient Stoics (notably Chrysippus) underestimated the extent to which emotion was a necessary component of psychological health and thus of virtue" (251), Becker sees no reason why contemporary Stoics such as himself cannot concede the mistake without damage to underlying normative principles. Stoic ethical theory requires that we make our emotions appropriate. Those in extremis may need to heed Chrysippus' call for the extirpation of their emotions; the rest of us won't.

As the foregoing suggests, the papers collected in Stoicism: Traditions and Transformations are rich and varied. This reviewer would take issue with many of the claims but since the (alleged) problems don't diminish the basic originality and importance of the volume, they will be bypassed in favor of one global criticism. It concerns the objectives of the volume. In their generally helpful introduction, the editors say that "[t]he essays in this volume are intended to … [explore] how Stoicism actually influenced philosophers from antiquity through the modern period in fields ranging from logic and ethics to politics and theology" (1). In keeping with this mandate, many of the individual authors -- Engberg-Pedersen, Normore, Lagrée, Rutherford, Nussbaum -- do speak of instances of "actual influence" by Stoicism on this person or that concept. It would be absurd to deny that Stoicism was influential; yet, it is another thing entirely to prove specific cases of influence. And it is unclear why philosophers should care all that much: what we're more interested in is how the ideas and arguments compare, not where they came from. The task of determining influence is distinct, both conceptually and scholarly, from that of determining philosophical kinship. The former involves studies of the transmission and reception of texts; the latter, the analysis of the proximity of arguments. Whether they think so or not, almost all the papers in the volume engaged in the latter; many of the most important errors would have been avoided if they had recognized as much.