Strange Tools: Art and Human Nature

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Alva Noë, Strange Tools: Art and Human Nature, Hill and Wang, 2015, 285pp., $28.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780809089178.

Reviewed by Mohan Matthen, University of Toronto


We dance, sing, tap our fingers, tell stories, and draw pictures. These are natural activities; all of us participate. This gives us pleasure -- aesthetic pleasure. This seems obvious, but it engenders a puzzle. When gifted and trained dancers perform a choreographed work intended for an audience, it's art. When they or the rest of us dance spontaneously and freely, it isn't. Maybe Luciano Pavarotti hummed while he was brushing his teeth. His humming wasn't art.

Given that these activities are natural and universal, why is only some of it art? What is the difference between the art dancing of Misty Copeland and the spontaneous dancing of a child? Copeland is "better" at it, of course. She has extraordinary control over her body parts; she extends her limbs far more than most of us can; she demonstrates a fluidity of motion that a child can't manage. True, but surely it is not just this kind of skill that makes dancing "art?" (Is rhythmic gymnastics art? No, or if it is, it's a different art than ballet.) We enjoy it when we (or our children) dance, whether fluidly or not. What, other than enjoyment, do we get from Copeland? Why is her skill relevant except as a means to this end?

Alva Noë has an interesting and powerful answer to this question. To reduce it to a slogan: dance is organized activity; choreographed dance is reorganized activity provoked by reflection on the former. We dance by moving rhythmically; this is bodily movement organized to exemplify rhythm. Together with her choreographer, an artistic dancer reflects on these modes of organization and reorganizes it to capture, display, and perhaps to conceptualize, some aspect of it. Choreographers "don't make dances . . . they stage dances" (13). "Choreography casts light on one of the ways we are organized" (14). This looping structure makes it art.

The difference between dance and choreographed dance, rather than mere partiality, explains why we enjoy our child's attempt to sing but reject the efforts of the far more talented artiste who is wasting our time by publicly performing the Rite of Spring in a stiff and self-conscious way. They are doing different things. The child is merely enjoying herself, and we share her enjoyment in part because she is our child. The would-be performer is trying, but failing, to display a conceptually significant restructuring of the child's guileless activity; we judge him by the standard he achieves in this quite different activity.

In a running side thread, Noë compares art to philosophy.

Gaining knowledge is recollecting, Plato said. And what this statement means, here, is that it is not a matter of gathering new data; it's a matter of seeing how the data you already have -- your own experiences, observations, beliefs etc. -- hang together. . . The result isn't positive knowledge . . . [it] is something like understanding (17)

If aliens from outer space come down to earth and find a way of deciphering philosophical books, they will not be able to make sense of them. They won't share the puzzlements and entanglements that are the presupposition of philosophy. (137)

This doesn't work. When Plato says that knowledge is recollection, he means that as a simple statement of fact. When a philosopher of science asks whether there is a notion of function that biologists can legitimately use, she is not reorganizing biological thought as a choreographer reorganizes dance; she is rather engaging in philosophical thought. When Noë says that consciousness is not in the head, he is saying something that the alien from outer space can make sense of; he is not making a move in a cultural ritual or "practice." Enough said about this: philosophy is investigation, just as chemistry is.

Let's return to organization. The child organizes her activity instinctively. At the other, more skill-governed, pole of organized activity, there is advanced technology. This is a kind of organization that enables us to do entirely new things and think new thoughts. "Arithmetical notation is a tool for thinking thoughts that I (at least) couldn't think without it" (26). Technology is the antithesis of the child's spontaneous dance; it is (as much as art is) something that distinguishes humans from other animals. Yet, art is something different; technology is an evolving form of organization, art is reorganization. Noë writes: "The basic argument of this book is this: Our lives are structured by organization. Art is a practice for bringing our organization into view; in doing this, art reorganizes us." (29)

Noë's approach is very insightful and decidedly original, but perhaps it needs to be reined in a little. In the opening pages, he offers us so many examples and so many characterizations of organization that we begin to lose our grip on the kind of ground-level organization that lends itself to the kind of reorganization that constitutes art. In his opening pages, Noë describes breastfeeding as an organized activity; it is primitive, cognitively skilful, structured, cooperative, functional, and pleasurable, he says (5), later adding that organized activity is habitual (8). Aside from conversing ("conversation is an elaborated form of breastfeeding," 7 -- That this sentence made it into print shows that God made red pencils in vain) . . . aside from conversing, as I was saying, none of his examples are all of these things: dancing needn't be cooperative or functional; driving a car isn't primitive or cooperative; seeing isn't cooperative and needn't be pleasurable; breastfeeding is often not pleasurable and arguably too much of an individually learned skill to be primitive (or natural), at least in the way spontaneous dancing or singing is. (Breastfeeding is a contrived and difficult technology, as Noë's description brings out:[1] doubtless, human bipedality is a factor, combined with the relative inability of human infants to control their own motion and posture.)

The difference between organized and reorganized activities is to the fore when Noë discusses the evolution of the aesthetic attitude. He starts from an insight that he says he takes from Anne Hollander: seeing is "an act of thoughtful inspection [that] we get from pictures" (51). This, he reports Hollander as having said, is why we have couture and fashion; pictures shape how we see ourselves when we dress up; we dress to make a picture of ourselves. Noë insightfully leads us from this to a distinction between "wild seeing" and "aesthetic seeing:" wild seeing is "an openness to our world," a "contemplation of the world;" "it does not rest on deliberative acts of looking and inspecting" (51-52). "Aesthetic seeing, in contrast, is something more like the entertainment of thoughts about what one is looking at." Animals are incapable of the latter because they can't disengage with the world and reflect on it as if it were a picture (55). Wild seeing is organized, partly in response to social norms and practices; aesthetic seeing is reorganized.

There are actually two distinctions in play here, not one. The first is between seeing as openness to the world, or receptivity, and seeing as thoughtful inspection. The second is between seeing as contemplation of the world and seeing as reflexively informed by contemplation of seeing (not just thoughts about what one is looking at). The first distinction -- openness and receptivity vs inspection -- doesn't mark off the aesthetic; for as philosophers of science have long noted, it equally well characterizes skilled observation -- in microscopy, for example. The second distinction does arguably mark off the aesthetic: when I enjoy natural beauty or the beauty of art aesthetically, I am not merely gaining visual information; rather, I am engaged in the activity of looking because independently of what I learn about the world, the activity itself is pleasurable and rewarding.

The microscopist is not merely open to the world; her observations rest on "deliberate acts of looking and inspecting." Her seeing is not wild seeing. However, she is concerned with looking only as means -- her concern is primarily with the samples she observes. This is why her looking is not necessarily aesthetic (though it could be, if she also enjoyed looking for its own sake). This is not to deny that Noë's organization/reorganization rubric might still work. The microscopist is concerned with her sample and organizes looking accordingly; the art-appreciator is concerned with looking at (or more generally contemplating) the work, and she reorganizes this activity so as better to understand its meaning. Perhaps the reorganization is the source of her enjoyment.

The distinction of the preceding paragraphs helps counter Noë's criticism of evolutionary theories of aesthetics. He says that aesthetic appreciation cannot directly be an adaptation because contrary to theorists such as Ellen Dissanayake, art and "art behaviour" do not benefit us in the direct way that food or sex do. Noë allows that they may be secondary adaptations because making art and/or appreciating it might sufficiently be signs of genetic normality as to make them prerequisites for attracting mates. But this would be to treat of art "as just another cognitively challenging, widely entrenched technological practice." And as such it would be vacuous, he says.

Now, I am not clear why an evolutionary account of art should make it special in this sense -- nobody complains that if you explain both the heart and the liver as primary adaptations, you treat the heart as just another organ. Putting this puzzlement aside, Noë's criticism can be circumvented by distinguishing between contemplating something because (like the microscopist) you are interested in extracting information about it and contemplating it because doing so is pleasurable, independently of any consequence. Following this line of thought, the trick for evolutionary theories of art would not be to show that "art behaviour" is adaptive because art objects contribute to fitness. Rather, they should try to show how there could be something valuable (from an evolutionary perspective) in the activity of contemplating art. This would yield a looping and reflexive account similar to Noë's own -- contemplating art increases the value of contemplating art. I have myself tried to give such an account,[2] and though it is an evolutionary account, I am more than happy to acknowledge that it is both consistent with and enriched by Noë's idea that art reorganizes the activity of looking so as to display the value of looking.

Noë's take on art, which connects up to his antipathy to evolutionary theories, is that it mimics a tool but lacks function. Tools serve needs; art simply makes you think about those needs and how you serve them.

A tool has significance only in the context of its embedding. . . Deprive the picture of its context -- remove its caption, say, or its place in the family album -- . . . It ceases to depict.

Art is interested in removing tools . . . from their settings . . . A work of art is a strange tool, an alien implement. We make strange tools to investigate ourselves. (30)

The last sentence above exposes the contradiction implicit in this way of putting it. We do use these strange tools; they do have a function. This is why the case against evolutionary theories is not as straightforward as Noë makes it out to be.

Put this point aside. The strange tool idea has some very attractive applications. You can't understand the point of art by asking what artworks are used for. Think of ready-mades; the point is that as art they are not used -- that sheds light on how you enjoy art. Or think of photographic realism in painting. Surely the point is not to provide a pictorial record. Nobody tried it before photographs existed. The point must be to shed light on how one uses and responds to photographs. I could go on, but I find the thought bracing -- take a look at Noë's sympathy for baffled approaches, and his line of thought the chapter entitled "Why Is Art So Boring?" His observations are most instructive.

I have so far discussed what I take to be Noë's main positive ideas. There is also a critical theme in this book -- that art objects taken in isolation are not art:

Artworks are dead in themselves, like mere noise or useless stuff. We bring them to life by putting them to work in thought, conversation, and appreciation. They have power in the way that jokes have power, as moves in a game of communication and reflection. Maker and public jointly undertake the work that makes art possible. (137)

This idea is at the heart of Noë's rejection of "neuroaesthetics," the attempt to understand the human appeal of art by studying its effects on the brain. You can study how artworks affect the brain, Noë argues, but this will not amount to studying aesthetic appreciation because aesthetic appreciation is not about the object taken by itself. This seems correct: psychological aesthetics studies our preferences for certain patterns, or colour combinations, or musical patterns. But this tells us just about nothing about aesthetics. It might be that Beethoven's Op. 111 contains a high concentration of musical tropes proven to be pleasing to laboratory subjects when they are presented in isolation. How much will this explain about our appreciation of Op. 111?

This said, Noë's critique is embedded in an attitude for which I have less sympathy. His argument runs like this: brain events get their meaning from an animal's activities in its environment. So meaning isn't inside the head. Therefore, "Consciousness is not a neural event inside us, although it depends causally on such events" (124). There is a fallacious slide here from saying that the meaning or content of a conscious state isn't in the head to the assertion that consciousness itself is not in the head. Suppose (to adapt an example of Noë's, 122) that a brain duplicate of mine exists in Russia and that he is standing in Red Square while I am standing in a holographic duplicate of Red Square. I concede that his perceptual consciousness would not have the same meaning as mine; his is about Red Square and mine is not. Nevertheless, a given brain state of his would be conscious if and only if the duplicate brain state of mine is. To put it in phenomenological terms, consciousness is in the brain but consciousness-of is not. We are both conscious, but his consciousness is of Red Square. The reason is not confined to the brain.

This is a very personal book; it contains many autobiographical details ("My father . . . ran a bar in New York City") and personal reactions to art works ("I was moved, stunned really, by Sarah Michelson's work"). While the ideas that I have summarized so far, and others, are fresh and valuable, there are points where it settles into aphorism, anecdote, and paradox. And I found myself quite distressed at times by the prose. "The general form of the work of art is: See me if you can! The work of art dares you to try, to look hard enough so that you can." (102)

It doesn't do me credit, I am sure, but I lost sleep over this. For one thing, "See me if you can" is illogical here -- "and before you see the lawyer, preferably" is the sort of continuation one expects. Besides: the cadence, the metre, the prosody are wrong -- it sounds very different from the snappy "Catch me if you can," which (presumably) it is trying to riff on. Ambitious prose demands harder work.

The above gnomon ("in the spirit of the younger Wittgenstein") comes after a brief recapitulation of the theory of tools: normally, they enable function, and sometimes they create it, but always in a cognitively transparent way. "When you walk up to a door, you don't stop to inspect the doorknob; you just turn it and go right through. Doorknobs don't puzzle us" (100). "If you even notice the knob, it's potentially bad design" (101). (Surely, this is not true of sextants and slide rules, not to mention the Large Hadron Collider. And what about this? It begs for attention. Is it bad design or just bad art?) Art, by contrast, operates in the absence of function or need; it is opaque. "When we ask of a work of art What is this? What is this for? we need to come up with our own answer." (Well, maybe: but this is truer of some works than others, and it isn't the only measure of artistic merit.)

I think Noë meant something quite simple: Art isn't made to serve mundane human needs. To appreciate the needs it serves, you have to interpret it. Is this a big enough thought to merit the packaging? Look at the discussion of Leonardo (105-106) that follows the above and try to figure out what deeper point it makes. I don't question that in these pages, Noë says something interesting about Leonardo. (But what kind of writing is this? "I know of only one painting of Leonardo in which the eyes of the person and the hands are open to our inspection [the Salvator Mundi]." And then in the same paragraph, "Actually, there is another . . . the Mona Lisa.") My question is: What does the discussion of Leonardo say about art, beyond the all-but-truism I extracted at the start of this paragraph?

I will end with this. The central ideas of this book are important and original; they will be widely discussed. It's a surprise to find them embedded in such an informal and personal work; usually when philosophers write books accessible to the public, they have pre-tested the ideas in technical papers. I couldn't quite figure out whether it is philosophy in an odd framework or a popular delivery of something that isn't quite philosophy. One way or another, it's a bold and somewhat disorienting venture. Perhaps it will be a transformational one.

[1] See also Courtney Jung, Lactivism: How Feminists and Fundamentalists, Hippies and Yuppies, and Physicians and Politicians Made Breastfeeding Big Business and Bad Policy. New York: Basic Books, 2015.

[2] In my account, contemplating art is a primary, not a secondary, adaptation. And I distinguish between the primary and the secondary attractors of art, which parallels Noë's organization-reorganization distinction. See Matthen, "Play, Skill, and the Origins of Perceptual Art," British Journal of Aesthetics 55 (2) (2015): 173-197. I elaborate the looping, self-reinforcing nature of aesthetic pleasure in "The Pleasure of Art," Australasian Philosophical Review 1 (1) (2017): forthcoming.