Strangers, Gods and Monsters

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Kearney, Richard, Strangers, Gods and Monsters, Routledge, 2002, pp. 304, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415272580.

Reviewed by Jeffrey L. Kosky , Washington & Lee University


Strangers, Gods and Monsters is part of a three-volume work also including Richard Kearney’s two recent publications, On Stories and The God Who May Be. If we think of this triptych according to philosophical disciplines, the other volumes might constitute Kearney’s anthropology and theology while Strangers, Gods and Monsters would be his ethics; for it is pervaded by questions bespeaking unmistakable ethical concern: How do we respond to the enigma of otherness represented by the forms named in the title? And, just as importantly, how is concern for others balanced by the need to heal our own fragmented lives?

Kearney’s exploration of our relation to these others passes through readings of philosophy, literature, film, and media portrayals of current events. He is one of the rare philosophers who can write as deftly on the socio-politics of René Girard and the philosophy of Jacques Derrida as on Hamlet and James Joyce, without neglecting icons of popular culture such as Apocalypse Now Redux and Aliens. All of these topics are included in Strangers, Gods, and Monsters. The chapter reflecting on the attacks of September 11, 2001, bears special mention for both its probity and its useful review of responses penned by noted cultural figures such as Jean Baudrillard, Noam Chomsky, and Ian McEwan. Reading Richard Kearney, one begins to doubt the claim that nobody since the nineteenth century has read all the books in the world; perhaps Richard has! And to top it off, he’s an excellent photographer, as demonstrated by the frontispieces to several chapters.

In taking the question of otherness to be fundamental to a reflection on who we are, Kearney assumes the critique of the self-assertive, self-grounding autonomous subject of modern metaphysics. Following the positions of Emmanuel Levinas and the ethical turn of criticism in thinkers such as Derrida, Julia Kristeva, Jean-François Lyotard, and John D. Caputo, Kearney argues that “the modern idolatry of the ego” (229) involves injustice to the other. He analyzes this injustice as it is enacted in cultural practices of sacrifice and scapegoating, the projection of repressed instincts into the forms of demons and monsters, and the reduction of the other to the same in laws of immigration.

Nevertheless, the real target of Strangers, Gods and Monsters turns out to be those very postmoderns whose critique of the subject first raised the question of the other. Turning his critical apparatus against them, Kearney aims to depart from the “postmodernist obsession with absolutist ideas of exteriority and otherness … lest it lead to a new idolatry: that of the immemorial, ineffable Other” (229). What he fears is that the emphasis on unsettling the self in order to open the self to the other will leave us paralyzed, unable to act because, more fundamentally, we are unable to make judgments that would discern good and evil, the holy stranger and the wicked villain, God and the nihilistic abyss.

The supposed postmodern paralysis stems from two related strands of thinking. The first is found in thinkers such as Kristeva and Lyotard for whom the other is given in a sublime experience of infinite transcendence. Before this absolutely other, “the human self finds itself reduced to nothing, exposed to the inhuman feeling of [quoting Lyotard] ’being dumb, immobilized and as good as dead’“ (p. 93). Levinas, too, betrays an affinity with this postmodern sublime in that, according to him, the Other is given in an experience of responsibility which borders on horror—since the self is haunted by a spectral, absent other that was never present but will always remain immemorial. In all cases, Kearney argues, otherness is inflated to the point that its appearance entails violence against the self and leaves the overwhelmed self unable to act in response.

The second, related source of postmodern paralysis is emphasized by the deconstructive ethics of thinkers such as Derrida and Caputo. Starting from the sublime model of absolute alterity, these thinkers leave human action dangling in undecidability. Since the sublime other

surpasses all our categories of interpretation and representation, we are left with a problem—the problem of discernment. How can we tell the difference between benign and malign others? … How do we account for the fact that not every other is innocent and not every self is an egoistic emperor? (67).

For Kearney, deconstructive ethics is unable to answer these questions—indeed it is premised on the idea that these questions evade the dilemma that constitutes the very unconditionality of ethics. To ask to know who the other is, to demand that the other identify itself before I accept or reject obligation is, on their reading,to make ethical obligation conditional on me and my knowledge of the other. Ethics, however, must not discriminate; it must be open to indiscriminate otherness so it always risks opening the door to its own undoing.

Now for Kearney, when Derrida and Caputo talk of undecidability, they are avoiding questions fundamental to ethical action. “For deconstruction [Kearney writes] aliens only come in the dark; and we are always in the dark when they come … . If all reading is in the dark how can we even begin to discern”, between, for instance, Abraham’s leap of faith in response to God and madmen like Jim Jones, David Koresh, and Muhammad Atta “who believe they are recipients of messianic messages from some Other they call God” (70-71). Above all, Kearney wants to preserve the distinction between faith and madness, justice and injustice, God and Satan. For, he argues, ethical action depends on the clarity and certainty with which we can ascertain these distinctions.

Between the modern and postmodern extremes, between affirmation of the autonomous self at the expense of the other and the infinite inflation of the Other to the detriment of the self, Kearney seeks a middle ground where “the self walks at sea level with the other” (11). This middle ground, he argues (with indebtedness to his teacher, Paul Ricoeur), is charted by a diacritical hermeneutics that champions dialogue and conversation where welcoming alterity alters the self. Proposing the encounter of self and other as neither a fusion of horizons resulting in a community of like minds nor an abandonment of horizons culminating in the fragmented world of complete separation, diacritical hermeneutics “ensures that the other does not collapse into sameness or exile itself into some inaccessible alterity; hermeneutics keeps in contact with the other” (81).

We stay in contact with others, according to Kearney, in and through the hermeneutic struggle to better understand them. But understanding the other is only possible for one who “is careful to discern, in some provisional fashion at least, between different kinds of otherness” (77). This critical discernment, Kearney suggests, “lets the other be other in the right way” (8)—where the adverbial phrase “in the right way” distinguishes diacritical hermeneutics from radical hermeneutics (Caputo), where undecidability reigns, and from radical ethics (Levinas) where the other is the norm of rightness and so is always in the right way. Kearney’s hermeneutic supplements the postmodern critique of subjectivity with a critique of the other that aims to free the criticized self from the tyranny of the other. This furthers the ethical task of making us more hospitable to strangers while ensuring that our hospitality will not be our undoing.

A second, and related, tool that Kearney mobilizes in his critical hermeneutic of action is the narrative imagination. He agrees with the postmoderns that ethics answers the question “what is to be done?” not on the basis of theoretical knowledge of an abstract or universal Good, but with a practical understanding of the singular situation confronting us in the here and now. This opens a place within ethics for the narrative imagination, in that narrative transfers the ethical problem from the realm of theory to the realm of practical understanding. We make sense of the singular situations in which life is lived by telling stories, for fiction grasps the representational particularity of events. Though we might not know what evil is as such, we can tell stories that let us identify particular evils and ground action against them.

The narrative imagination, however, is ultimately turned against postmodernist ethics in that, for Kearney, it allows us to escape the paralysis of action resulting from another category by which the sublime other is articulated: the Ineffable Immemorial. Kearney identifies two related ways in which the Immemorial and Ineffable is invoked. In the first, thinkers such as Levinas use the Immemorial to interrupt the self’s presence to itself, a self-presence by which the self assumes the position of subject or ground underlying all that is. Lying beyond recollection, the Immemorial protects the alterity of the other by refusing to allow it to be represented in the present where it can be grasped, domesticated or appropriated to a subjective project or experience. Secondly, the Ineffable Immemorial is invoked by Holocaust thinkers. The dead are dishonored by the attempt to retrieve the past and make it available for historical explanation—since to explain the horrors is to suppose that they had a purpose or reason and to make them comparable to other historical events, thus denying, again, the unspeakable singularity of the horrors suffered in Auschwitz.

According to Kearney, however, this supposedly ethical invocation of the ineffable and immemorial leads to paralyzing the subject of action. Best dramatized in Shakespeare’s Hamlet, the valorization of the immemorial results in an impossible mourning and incurable melancholy, like that which plagues the prince of Denmark from the opening scene where he is haunted by the secret of his father’s ghost, a secret he is forbidden to reveal. Bound to, and by, the Immemorial, the subject, like Hamlet, is doomed to an obsessive repetition of traumatic events that only defers real action in the present. What cures the subject, according to Kearney, is cathartic remembering belonging to narrative imagination—like that which Hamlet experienced in the graveyard scene when he confronts the “original forgetfulness that has blighted the kingdom” (154). In its backward movement of remembering, the narrative imagination thus gives the past hope for a future by inhabiting a present moment “of transfiguration [that] turns a paralysed melancholic into a wise subject of action” (157).

Now, transfiguration and clear decisiveness are comforting and empowering. But I cannot avoid the suspicion that Kearney purchases them at the price of misrepresenting the undecidable and the immemorial, which is to say that he has provided answers by altering the question posed by the postmodern condition.

As Caputo has reminded Kearney, undecidability is not the same thing as not deciding. Rather, undecidability is the condition for the possibility of decision. There would be no need for human decision if it were clear what is to be done, what is good and what is evil, who a saint and who a villain. In that case, human action would be simply a programmed result or the application of a technique that would apply in all similar situations. Decision is called for, however, because the singularity of events means that each situation exceeds, or falls short of, the universals uttered by the rule or the law which let us know what to do. Because we always have to act before all the information is in, every decision springs from undecidability. In this sense, undecidability does not paralyze action. It does, however, imply that action is haunted by the shadow of a doubt.

Kearney, however, seems to take all the agony, all the acuity out of a decision. He leaves no scission in decision, no cut that cuts off other possibilities. While this may be a sure way to sleep easier and live with a clean conscience, it omits the central place of guilt in ethics—as if in choosing to act I did not abandon another life-path or sacrifice another other, paths or others that humility would admit might also be right or equally demanding of my attention.

I have the impression that for Kearney the decision has already been decided, that I have arrived after the decisive moment. How else could the problem be posed in terms of an alternative between the terrorist and the needy stranger? This way of putting it omits the harder but perhaps more everyday occurrence of having to choose between two relative goods—between, as Derrida puts it in The Gift of Death, my cat and all the other starving cats. This choice is made every day, though the everyday is founded on forgetting the moment of decision as we reach for the bag. It cannot be justified (why did I let those others die by failing to feed them?), though reason can surely rationalize it (trying to feed them all would be my own undoing and then none would be fed). By posing the dilemmas he does, Kearney avoids these everyday situations where guilt (letting those other cats die in responding ethically to this other) is inseparable from responsible action—even when deciding for a Good. In this avoidance of the cut of decision and the inevitability of guilt, Kearney would evidence a very modern anthropology. We have an ethical conscience, but an easy one—that is to say, a conscience that is easily put at ease by the conviction that we are doing Good.

A similar easy ease is evident, too, in Kearney’s treatment of the Immemorial. Yes, the immemorial calls for stories; only by authorizing fiction can we approach a cure. But our narrative reckonings with the immemorial are never final, our cure never once and for all, our analysis never terminable. The immemorial gives rise to storytelling, but it also frustrates storytelling—dooming narrative to incompletion and making it necessary to retell the story again and again since no one version could ever be adequate to what cannot be remembered. It is not that about which we keep silent, but that about which we must speak again and again precisely because no story is ever adequate to it. Strangers, Gods, and Monsters gives the impression that, through stories, we say to the Immemorial, “Get thee behind me,” when in fact the immemorial means precisely what cannot be gotten over once and for all and so what always remains ahead of me as part of my never-ending story still to tell.

The challenge that the immemorial poses, then, is not how to achieve redeeming transformation or transfiguration, but how to get on without transformation or transfiguration. How are we to act, we for whom such transfiguration does not arrive? Where are we to find the courage to act without redemptive transformation? This is not the issue that Kearney addresses, but it is a crucial constituent of the postmodern world. The ethics that Kearney criticizes, precisely because it endures a lack of transfiguration, is more attuned to the difficult situation out of which action must spring.

Granting these reservations, it is clear that Kearney has done much to help clarify the ethical intentions of thinkers such as Levinas, Derrida, and Caputo. His objections have pushed toward clarification of the difference between undecidability and indecision, and in doing so have reminded us of the necessity of deciding and doing, the need to distinguish between willed allegiance to the supposed immemorial and ethical subjection to the immemorial.