Strawson and Kant

Placeholder book cover

Glock, H-J. (ed), Strawson and Kant, Oxford, 2003, 260pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199252823

Reviewed by Andrew Chignell, Cornell University


This book collects the proceedings of a 1999 UK Kant Society conference held in honor of Sir Peter Strawson, who is heralded by the editor (not implausibly) as “the leading proponent of analytic Kantianism.” Like most Festschriften, the book is a smorgasbord: while each of the papers has something to do with either Strawson or Kant, there are some—such as Robert Stern’s paper on Strawson’s naturalism or John Hyman’s on the causal theory of perception—that don’t attempt to be about both. A less wieldy but more accurate title for the book would be Strawson and/or Kant.

Still, many of the contributions hang together nicely, and two in particular (by H-J. Glock and P.M.S. Hacker) offer illuminating accounts of Strawson’s place in the history of Kant interpretation and analytic philosophy in general. I will discuss those essays in more detail below. There are also two essays (by Eckart Förster and Henry Allison) on the third Critique, and two (by Tobias Rosefeldt and Maximilian de Gaynesford) on the Kantian view of the self. Another pair (by Graham Bird and Barry Stroud) compare the merits of Strawson’s “descriptive metaphysics” to those of traditional “revisionary” metaphysics, taking as a focus Strawson’s account of the synthetic . priori.

Strawson’s own “A Bit of Intellectual Autobiography” picks up where he left off in the Library of Living Philosophers volume (Hahn 1998), although in this essay he focuses more on his relationship to Kant. The method in The Bounds of Sense, he writes, was “to preserve and present systematically what I took to be the major insights of Kant’s work, while detaching them from those parts of the total doctrine that, if they had any substantial import at all, I took to be at best false, at worse mysterious to the point of being barely comprehensible” (8-9). Strawson thus happily accepts the charge, often leveled by more serious historians of philosophy, that his rational reconstructions have as much to do with twentieth-century Oxford as they do with eighteenth-century Königsberg.

The rest of Strawson’s contribution is a pastiche (as its title suggests), ranging over his own personal history, a short critique of Rae Langton’s recent book on the first Critique, and a discussion of his relationship to Wittgenstein. He includes a strikingly non-Wittgensteinian brief on behalf of both the existence of “abstract intensional objects” (like propositions) and “the reality of subjective experience in all its richness and complexity,” concluding with a provocative embrace of the “Platonism and Cartesianism” that these doctrines involve.

Like Strawson, some of the other contributors take a position on the issue of appropriate methodology in Kant interpretation. Kenneth Westphal, for instance, begins by explicitly rejecting Strawson’s approach, described as the “somewhat ahistorical attempt to recruit Kant to the ranks of the analytical metaphysicians, while discarding those metaphysical elements that refused any such absorption” (9). Westphal retorts that Kant’s philosophy will only seem plausible if, “instead of incorporating Kant’s transcendental proofs into present-day philosophical attitudes…[we] reconsider some of our current philosophical attitudes in order to understand and benefit from Kant’s transcendental proofs” (127).

In this spirit, Westphal argues that the Refutation of Idealism can succeed as an argument against external-world skepticism, but only if we first accept Kant’s “non-Cartesian” picture of the mind. This requires granting that any self-conscious experience involves both receptivity to external objects on the part of sensibility and active synthesis on the part of understanding. One wonders, of course, whether presuming this substantive thesis about our cognitive psychology doesn’t beg important questions against the skeptic and against empiricists generally. But Westphal provides some illuminating thought-experiments designed to give the thesis independent, intuitive support.

Quassim Cassam’s essay, by contrast, is classic Strawsonian (and thus revisionist) Kantianism. His stated goal is to salvage an important insight in Kant—that we can justify some synthetic claims involving the categories without appeal to experience—for the purposes of contemporary consumption. But in doing so he rejects as hopeless many of Kant’s own ideas about the . priori, including the anti-empiricist claim that the categories are not derived from experience. My sense is that most of the contributors would side with Cassam over Westphal in preferring the Strawsonian methodology—naturally enough in a volume honoring Strawson’s work.

Although Stroud does not continue his famous controversy with Strawson over the efficacy and scope of transcendental arguments (Stroud 1968), Thomas Grundmann and Catrin Misselhorn do. In their co-written contribution, they argue (pace Stroud) that some transcendental arguments do have the capacity to prove something about mind-independent reality, rather than merely proving something about how we must conceive of it. This claim is Strawsonian in spirit, even though Strawson himself has now accepted Stroud’s criticisms and adopted a Humean-style naturalism as the metaphysical realist’s only viable response to skepticism (Strawson 1985). Grundmann and Misselhorn’s argument is flawed, however, by its reliance on the extraordinary premise that, “necessarily, our perceptual beliefs about the external world are largely true” (207). Later I will suggest that their defense of this premise—via an externalism about content plus some overly strict rules about what it would be for a skeptical scenario to count as worrisome—raises far more questions than it answers.

As anyone familiar with these names will recognize, Glock has done a nice job of bringing together authors hailing from the three main regions of contemporary Kant scholarship (the UK, North America, and Germany), and ranging in experience from the up-and-coming to the world-famous. It is particularly significant that there are so many Germans involved, since it is often assumed that the more philologically and historically oriented scholars on the Continent turn up their collective noses at the perceived crudities of Strawson-style Kantianism. The fourteen essays together comprise a manageable 250-page volume which should be of interest to Kantians, Strawsonians, and many historians of analytic philosophy as well. In what follows, I will discuss the essays by Glock, Hacker, and Grundmann/Misselhorn in more detail.

Glock’s and Hacker’s essays recount the well-known story of the emergence of analytic philosophy in Britain in the 20th-century, but are unique in that they highlight that tradition’s complex and often contested relationship to Kant. The story starts with the rejection of neo-Kantianism and the Hegelianism that was its heir in Britain, a rejection that (allegedly) drove analytic philosophy to its anti-metaphysical extremes in the 20s and 30s. It culminates with the collapse of the positivist program and the return to a chastened form of speculation in the 50s and 60s, aided at least in part by Strawson’s defense of descriptive metaphysics and his appeal to Kant as its primary forebear.

Glock also releases a salvo on Strawson’s behalf in the ongoing battle between idealist and non-idealist interpreters of Kant. The former think Kant is committed to the claim that the existence of external objects consists, at bottom, in facts about perceivers, and they appeal in support of this thought to passages in which Kant enjoins us to regard appearances “as being, one and all, mere representations” (A369). Strawson often sounds like such an idealist interpreter, although he thinks of this as the “dark side” of the critical philosophy, and rejects it as unworkable.

On the other side are the non-idealist readers (Glock calls their view “platitudinous”) who insist that Kant is merely saying something about the “epistemic conditions” under which subjects with faculties like ours can know something about mind-independent objects (29). We have to cognize such objects, if we are to cognize them at all, as being in spatio-temporal and causal relations, but they can also be thought or considered in abstraction from such conditions. These “double-aspect” interpreters include many of Strawson’s critics, early and late—most notably Gerold Prauss and Henry Allison.

Glock’s taxonomy here is rather simplistic, since there are any number of middle positions and hybrids on the market (Langton’s non-Praussian but still non-idealist interpretation is a case in point). The taxonomy aids Glock dialectically, however, since he can then suggest that Strawson has come to the rescue with a third position which is more attractive than either of its alternatives. The “analytic interpretation” is supposed to provide a way of thinking about Kant, and especially about Kant’s claims regarding the synthetic . priori, that is both historically respectable and philosophically superior.

This claim is complicated, however, by the fact that “analytic Kantianism” is used somewhat loosely in this collection. Sometimes it refers broadly to the work of those like Strawson and Bennett who seek not so much to be historical scholars but rather (in Bennett’s words) to “fight Kant ’tooth and nail’“ as though Kant were a contemporary analytic philosopher sitting with us at the seminar-room table (19). At other times “analytic Kantianism” is used more narrowly as a rubric covering those in the Kant industry who take Strawson’s descriptive metaphysics to be a good model of what Kant was up to (at his best), and reconstruct his philosophy accordingly. The latter is clearly what Glock means to offer as a viable third way between idealism and platitudes.

But that leads, of course, to the question of what descriptive metaphysics actually is. Strawson himself, in Individuals, says this: “Descriptive metaphysics is content to describe the actual structure of our thought about the world, revisionary metaphysics is concerned to produce a better structure” (9). Precisely what to make of this distinction is widely-discussed in the Strawsonian tradition, and Glock, Hacker, and Bird provide detailed accounts in their respective essays. They agree, very broadly, that descriptive metaphysics involves the attempt to describe “the most general and pervasive features of human thought about the world” by inquiring into our “conceptual scheme, the connections between the fundamental concepts we use to think about and describe the world” (18).

If that is a fair characterization, then descriptive metaphysics is not much different from classic conceptual analysis, except that the concepts analyzed are, in Hacker’s words, “highly general, irreducible, basic, and, in a special sense, non-contingent” (49). Examples include “experience,” “self-consciousness,” “objectivity,” “space,” “time,” and “causation,” and Kant’s identification of them as essential to our mode of cognition is praised by Glock as “the central insight of the Critique” (20). It is also noted here that most analytic Kantians agree that the way to exploit this insight is not to follow Kant over to the “dark side” of genuine idealism.

This last point raises the concern, however, that despite the calls in this book to renew the enterprise of descriptive metaphysics, the old Stroudian worry has not yet been put to rest. The worry is simply that realism and descriptive metaphysics make excellent bedfellows with the skeptic. For without a commitment to idealism, what grounds are there for assuming that the empirical world conforms to the fundamental categories that the descriptive metaphysicians describe? Again, even if a transcendental argument shows that we must conceive of the empirical world in a certain way, it seems that there will always be room for the skeptic to drive a wedge of doubt between that conception of the world, and the world as it really is.

As I noted earlier, Grundmann and Misselhorn address that problem in their essay by suggesting that we can justifiably ignore the skeptic because the scenarios he appeals to are not genuinely conceivable and thus not demonstrably possible. This is a highly controversial claim, and it rests on the assumption that for the world of a skeptical scenario to be conceivable, it must be “explanatorily coherent.” A scenario fails that test if it appeals to “properties that are unintelligible, mysterious, or unexplainable within this world” (212).

But, first, why think it obvious that this constraint on conceivability holds? Can’t a world that is conceivable in the relevant sense contain some properties that are mysterious to us? Surely we can conceive of a world in which telepathy occurs, even though the relational properties between the minds involved would be quite mysterious.

There is a large debate in the background here, and no consensus on the precise sort of conceivability that is a good guide to metaphysical possibility (cf. Yablo 1993 and Gendler & Hawthorne 2002). But let’s set that aside and suppose that we accept this constraint on the relevant sort of conceivability. It still isn’t clear why an appeal to a Cartesian dreaming scenario or Putnam’s brain-in-a-vat scenario fails the test. Grundmann and Misselhorn say that “explanations within other [conceivable] worlds need not follow the laws of our actual world, but there must be some laws that do the explanatory work within these worlds” (212). But in some of the nearby worlds in which we are dreaming or envatted, surely there are such laws. In fact, in some of those worlds the laws are presumably the same as the laws in this world (the evil scientists in the nearest vat-worlds are simply much more advanced than we are in their understanding of neurobiology). There is thus no obvious reason to think that these worlds lack explanatory coherence.

A third, related point: it is unclear why Grundmann and Misselhorn think the skeptic has to accept the burden of showing that his scenarios are metaphysically possible by showing that they are conceivable in the relevant sense. His arguments will still have traction if he remains neutral about that, and simply highlights the epistemic possibility that, for all we know, the world of a skeptical scenario is both metaphysically possible and actual.

Let me emphasize that the main worry here is not about whether we can have justified beliefs on the basis of what descriptive metaphysicians tell us. For if they can show that we must conceptualize the world in a certain way, then no doubt we are justified in doing so on at least some conceptions of justification. The worry is rather about whether these inevitable, permissible, and in some sense justified beliefs adequately track reality. A merely descriptive analysis of fundamental categories cannot give us any assurance that they do. Kant puts the point this way:

If [the mind] has to conform to the constitution of the objects, then I do not see how we can know anything of them . priori; but if the object (as an object of the senses) conforms to the constitution of our faculty…, then I can very well represent this possibility to myself. (Bxvii)

In sum: analytic Kantians (in the narrow sense) offer us nothing to put in the place of what many readers take to be Kant’s own bona fide idealism, and so despite the ambitions of their transcendental arguments, they remain vulnerable to the skeptic. On this score, I think Strawson himself has done a better job at seeing the deficiencies of his early view than some of his followers.

As should be clear from this discussion, there is much that is of interest in this well-executed collection. The contributions are of a very high standard, although their content is somewhat disparate. Strawson and Kant is a fitting tribute to the man who has contributed more than anyone else to the rehabilitation of Kant studies in Anglophone philosophy.


Bennett, J. (1966) Kant’s Analytic. New York: Cambridge.

Gendler, T. S. & Hawthorne, J. eds. (2002) Conceivability and Possibility. New York: Oxford.

Hahn, L.E., ed. (1998) The Philosophy of P.F. Strawson, The Library of Living Philosophers, xxvi. Peru, Ill.: Open Court.

Kant, I. (1998) Critique of Pure Reason, trans Guyer, P. and Wood, A. New York: Cambridge.

Strawson, P.F. (1959) Individuals. London: Methuen.

--. (1966) Bounds of Sense. London: Methuen.
--. (1985) Skepticism and Naturalism. London: Methuen.

Stroud, B. (1968) “Transcendental Arguments,” Journal of Philosophy, 65.

Yablo, S. (1993) “Is Conceivability a Guide to Possibility?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 53.