Stricken by Sin, Cured by Christ: Agency, Necessity, and Culpability in Augustinian Theology

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Jesse Couenhoven, Stricken by Sin, Cured by Christ: Agency, Necessity, and Culpability in Augustinian Theology, Oxford University Press, 2013, 258pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199948697.

Reviewed by Matthew Drever, University of Tulsa


Though Augustine is one of the intellectual pillars of Western thought, he has endured his fair share of criticism. His doctrine of original sin, especially its iteration in late works such as Contra Julianum, is simultaneously one of his more influential and controversial positions, inspiring the likes of Luther but also ire among many. Criticism has continued down through the centuries, and today Augustine's accounts of original sin and what many see as the twin sister of predestination are theological pariahs in some circles. Jesse Couenhoven tackles head-on and defends core aspects of the late Augustine's doctrine of original sin. His book is primarily a work in moral philosophy that lays out a philosophically rigorous and capable model of moral compatibilism under the shadow (or light) of Augustinian original sin. According to Couenhoven, moral responsibility does not require a libertarian theory of freewill but rather is compatible with certain kinds of determining influences on self-identity, including sin. Couenhoven endeavors to show not only the logic of the position but also its benefit in making sense of a wide variety of contemporary moral commitments. The book also serves as a helpful prophylactic against theologically facile rejections of Augustine's account of original sin, and more broadly challenges us to think through the way moral responsibility may cohere with a picture where human identity is determinatively shaped through social and biological influences.

Couenhoven divides the book into two parts. The first offers an exegetical reconstruction and assessment of the doctrine of original sin Augustine develops in his late anti-Pelagian writings. Insofar as there is continued disagreement and misinterpretation of Augustine's doctrine, Couenhoven offers to Augustinian scholarship a helpful and critical guide through the doctrine. Chapters one and two lay out Augustine's account of original sin in terms of five independent doctrines that Couenhoven argues have various degrees of coherency. The primary doctrine on which he concentrates, and what he takes to be the heart of Augustine's account, is the notion of inherited sin in its twofold form of common guilt and a constitutional fault that disorders desire and generates ignorance. He also lays out four orbiting doctrines: original sin derives from the fall in the Garden of Eden, all humans share this sin through solidarity with Adam and Eve, all humans suffer a penalty because of this original sin, and both this sin and its penalty are somehow transmitted to future generations. Couenhoven spends time not only clarifying these doctrines but also critiquing many of them, including Augustine's historical reading of the Garden narrative, his ambiguous account of human solidarity with Adam, and his vacillation on how sin is transmitted to future generations. In the end, Couenhoven is less interested in resuscitating all of the doctrines that comprise Augustine's account of original sin than he is in drawing forward a notion of inherited sin that can ground his compatibilist model, remain plausible within a modern historical and scientific context, and make sense of the often tragic nature of human life.

Chapter three is the center of the first part of the book. Here Couenhoven develops Augustine's compatibilist model, which he argues is unusual in the kind of necessity it pairs with moral responsibility. Augustine rejects external necessitating force -- causal, coercive, or fate -- and opts instead for internal necessitating desires that shape our basic identity. Framing Augustine's anthropological account of how responsibility and necessity come together is his normative understanding of divine freedom: God is good and necessarily wills the good, not because of external compulsion but because it is God's nature to do the good. Augustine defines this as libertas, which is a freedom that coheres with necessity and is worthy of praise. Humans are not originally created with this freedom, but they do have a will and desire for the good that original sin undermines. Augustine parses the effects of sin on the will in a hierarchical manner in terms of voluntas and liberum arbitrium. Voluntas is the more basic power in the will, characterizing the human desires and ends that shape our moral orientation. Original sin disorders voluntas in a way humans cannot reorder, so that we now desire sin rather than God. Liberum arbitrium describes the human choice to follow our desires.

Against some interpretations, Couenhoven argues that liberum arbitrium, at least within the later Augustine, is not undetermined choice but rather is dominated by voluntas. Couenhoven prefers the term consent instead of choice to describe liberum arbitrium in its relation to voluntas: we consent to follow our desires rather than choose freely among them. Though humans cannot reorder their desires, Augustine holds us responsible for them because the determinative power stems from within us. Couenhoven iterates throughout this and the following chapters that an Augustinian account of responsibility is tied to the actions that arise from our character and does not require that we originally chose the nature of our character. We are responsible for who we are, not because we made ourselves who we are.

In the second part of the book Couenhoven brings Augustine's framework forward to develop his own compatibilist model within the context of contemporary social ontology. Though the connection between necessity and responsibility may strike many as offensive, Couenhoven seeks to demonstrate that both contemporary society and philosophy accept that there is much about our identity we do not self-create and yet embrace, enact, and own such that we become responsible for it. The heart of Couenhoven's constructive endeavor occurs in chapters four and five where he explores a moral theory of what, borrowing from Susan Wolf, he terms deep responsibility. Eschewing baseline libertarian concepts of autonomy and self-conscious choice, he develops an expansive notion of responsibility that traverses beyond autonomous agency in rooting responsibility within personhood rather than freewill. Couenhoven's change of frameworks utilizes a deft conceptual touch and has a twofold goal: to shift action theory in a more virtue-oriented direction by showing there is a range in moral responsibility that is tied to the way persons own their actions; and to show the complex relation between responsibility, blame, and punishment.

Regardless of their origin, we are responsible at least to a minimal degree for the actions we personally own that stem from our properly functioning beliefs and loves. Couenhoven acknowledges that his account runs the risk of making people responsible for too much and calls on the notion of proper function as a limiting concept for determining responsibility. Given the way he centers responsibility on personhood, he is most interested in the boundaries between properly functioning and malfunctioning personhood. Here Couenhoven moves beyond Augustine's discussion of original sin into an analysis of various psychological conditions (e.g., autism, kleptomania, ASPD) in order to probe the range and diversity of necessitating forces and the way we ascribe responsibility for conditions that are not self-created. Throughout this analysis, Couenhoven highlights two basic themes. First, responsibility can be consistent with a fractured and divided self, which swirls with unconscious undercurrents of necessitating identity-forming influences. We do not need to be self-made unified persons in order to be responsible. Second, compatibilism need not be couched in absolutist terms; that is, we are not required to maintain that we are absolutely determined in and wholly responsible for all we do. There are degrees of determinism, for example in the way social, psychological, and biological factors influence us, and there is a spectrum of greater and lesser responsibility based on the way these factors more or less inhibit the proper functioning of the self.

In the final chapters Couenhoven discusses various implications of his compatibilist position. In chapter six he addresses the concerns that we might be responsible without being free and that with original sin we are being blamed for a kind of bad moral luck. Couenhoven uses the opportunity to further undercut the link between responsibility and libertarian notions of freewill, running through everyday practices, religious and nonreligious, that suggest ways responsibility exceeds freedom. In chapter seven he defends the conceptual core of Augustine's doctrine of original sin, namely that we can be held responsible for sin, at least to a minimal degree, despite the fact that our sinful practices and identity is formed by a variety of necessitating influences. At the same time, he seeks to distance himself from some doctrines that accompany Augustine's account of original sin, especially Augustine's claims that infants are sinners from birth and that there is a single original sin all humans inherit from Adam. Couenhoven's most interesting move comes in his exploration of sexism as a type of original sin. Despite some recent feminist critiques of Augustine, he contends that an Augustinian conception of how necessitating forces shape and distort human identity has strong thematic resonance with and can lend conceptual clarity to the way feminists construct notions of agency and assign blame within and against patriarchal models.

One minor quibble I have with Couenhoven's book is that the theme of grace is underdeveloped in comparison to that of original sin. My griping here is not too significant since Couenhoven sets out to defend an Augustinian compatibilism and rightly sets his sights on developing a modified version of Augustine's more controversial doctrine of original sin. Still, as Couenhoven notes, Augustine's views on sin and grace belong as a pair in his account of human agency, necessity, and salvation. The final chapter, in which Couenhoven takes up Augustine's notion of operative grace, offers the most extensive discussion of the topic. Apart from this chapter, however, his discussion of grace is more incidental to the main line of argument than constitutive of it. In this, the book title is a bit misleading as his work is not primarily theological and has little to say on Christology and soteriology. That being said, this does not substantially impact the significance of Couenhoven's model but simply acknowledges further work to be done.

There may also be a missed opportunity to revisit Augustine's relation to Pelagianism. In line with contemporary philosophical anthropology, Couenhoven frames the formative, necessitating influences on the self in terms of its social (and biological) context, which leads him into a fairly robust imitation model of sin. This becomes all the more pronounced in his selective handling of Augustine's account of original sin. On one hand, Couenhoven rejects Augustine's accounts of an historical fall and of infants born into sin, choosing instead to think of original sins as developing in a more diffusive manner within historical and social contexts and through normal social and psychological human development. On the other hand, he is rightly critical of Augustine's often vague and evasive account of how humans participate in Adam's original sin and the way this is transmitted through the generations. In the absence of any better determination of our ontological link with Adam, Couenhoven's positioning of the self within its social context fills the void. He notes that Augustine embraces the social transmission of sin to a limited extent in the way parents can transmit sin and righteousness to their children, but largely rejects it because of its connection with Pelagianism. He claims his model preserves the spirit if not the letter of Augustine and does not amount to a rapprochement with Pelagius. I think this is right given that Couenhoven connects sin's social transmission not to freewill but rather to the socializing influences that form the basic contours of the self and over which we have only limited control. But it might have helped if Couenhoven more clearly and precisely laid out Augustine's debate with Pelagius on this issue and where his own model places him within that debate.

Couenhoven rightly foresees that one potential objection to his model lies in Augustine's claim that sin is like a sickness, with Christ its medicine. If original sin universally affects humanity, then perhaps we are all operating with diminished capacity like those with psychological disorders. Far from expanding responsibility, his model would seem to dramatically limit it. Couenhoven makes two related points against this objection. First, for Augustine sin involves a violation in the relationship with God and others, whereas disease degrades one dimension of the person rather than the relation of the whole person to someone else. In this, sin is a qualitatively different type of degradation within the person. Second, illnesses such as dementia can degrade the person such that there is no functioning selfhood. By contrast, Augustine's account of sin as the privation of the good requires a prior, properly functioning self that is deformed by sin. The distinctions between illness and sin Couenhoven draws seem to hold on more general and Augustinian grounds, though I worry to some extent about the latter. There is concern that as Augustine progresses through the Pelagian controversy, the sinful self he confronts increasingly becomes an aporia to himself. At times one wonders whether Augustine may be confronting a profound sense of a self that is not properly functioning. As Couenhoven points out, the person's relation to God and other people is central to Augustinian anthropology, and Couenhoven admits he is not sure how deep the concept of relation goes in Augustine's account.

Let me suggest that it penetrates to the core. There are times when Augustine speaks of a substantial self that exists and comes into relation, but as one further explores his use of substance one finds that relation for him is a prior metaphysical category: humans do not exist (substantially) and come into relation, humans exist as selves in relation. The implication is that there is no self outside relation. This is at the heart of Augustine's doctrine of creation and constitutes the nature of human finitude. Admittedly, Augustine does not follow this line out, and his continued reliance on substance metaphysics mitigates some of its effects. But within a discussion of original sin it means that two pictures may be emerging: following his metaphysical theory of evil as the privation of the good, sin distorts a previously good self; and somewhat in tension with this, it may also be that in distorting the human relation with God sin moves to the origins of the self and distorts personhood itself. Couenhoven rightly notes that Augustine rejects the strong implications of this claim, namely that sin destroys the divine image. But recall that Augustine does so based on a critique of his own previous claim that sin does precisely this. There is a worry and tension in Augustine concerning the depth and destructiveness of sin and the ways it unravels the self. He certainly maintains that we own our sin, but his account may not be as dissimilar as Couenhoven suggests to that of someone with diminished capacity.

All told, Couenhoven offers a significant and provocative contribution to moral philosophy and a needed corrective in Augustinian studies to discussions of original sin. In this, his book traverses the domains of historical scholarship and contemporary moral debates, and should be read both by experts interested in the latter as well as by theologians attempting to balance accounts of human agency with the depth and pervasiveness of sin.