Structural Injustice: Power, Advantage, and Human Rights

Structural Injustice Power Advantage And Human Rights Book Cover

Madison Powers and Ruth Faden, Structural Injustice: Power, Advantage, and Human Rights, Oxford University Press, 2019, 306pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190053987.

Reviewed by Robert Guay, Binghamton University


Structural injustice is a compelling topic. This is in part because its currency in contemporary discourse has exceeded the intensity of its philosophical discussion. Claims of structural injustice are increasingly familiar, but this has not been prompted by theoretical developments; if anything, philosophy has some catching up to do. The other compelling feature in the topic of structural injustice is that only the negative has gained such contemporary currency. No one speaks of a structurally just world, in which, presumably, agency is unbounded by exploitation and oppression, rewards and burdens are merited, and distributions are satisfactory, etc.; understanding of the topic has come about through the experience of profound failures. In light of this situation, and for other reasons, a theoretical treatment of structural injustice is particularly welcome.

In their book, Madison Powers and Ruth Faden offer "a theory that captures the central injustices of large-scale forms of social organization" (1). The theory is difficult to summarize. One might expect a brief statement of the theory, followed by an elaborate explanation and defense. In this case, however, I think the entire book is the theory; it seems impossible to distinguish between the basic principles and the particulars. Nevertheless, I can report that the theory characterizes injustices in terms of deprivations of the "core elements of well-being characteristic of a decent human life" (4). These deprivations count as injustices when they stem from human rights violations, on the one hand, and unfair patterns of social structure, on the other hand; the authors insist that, although they are separable in principle, "human rights violations and structural unfairness are inseparably connected in ordinary contexts and belong in one theory of structural injustice" (3). Structural unfairness is accounted for in terms of the power that some groups exert, giving them unjustified forms of control, that in turn produces systemic effects that further disadvantage already-marginalized groups. The authors, furthermore, recommend a "pragmatic approach" (68) to identifying particular claims of justice, since the institutions that protect core human interests are historically contingent. There are many other features of their theory: accounts of human rights, the responsibilities of states, and the permissibility of strategies of resistance, for example. At the center of their analysis, however, is that justice is a special case of the moral interest in others' welfare, and structural injustice is a special case of justice that pertains to "impacts traceable to social-structural influence" (7) and "elements of well-being that generally require institutionalized formal protections" (14).

All of this provokes a question: what is a theory of structural injustice anyway? Presumably, not every discussion of something qualifies as theory, but there are many different ways to fulfill a theoretical interest in structural injustice. Here are some initial possibilities for what it might mean to offer a theory. A theory might (A) offer principles for the assessment of social and political institutions in terms of structural injustice. It might (B) offer prescriptive guidance on how to remedy structural injustice. It might (C) allow us to recognize structural injustice where it is not otherwise apparent, perhaps by identifying which structures ought to be subject to special normative scrutiny. It might (D) delineate and distinguish distinctively structural concerns from other aspects of justice. It might (E) offer a general account of how certain domains of the social world function, so as to provide an explanation of how structural injustices come about. It might (F), given recognized cases of structural injustice, explain why they are considered as such. It might (G) explain and legitimate the very category of structural injustice: that is, defend the importance of such a form of assessment. This list is of course not exhaustive, and one would expect at least some of some these projects to be interconnected. But this list might help to identify what kind of theory is at issue here.

From what I can tell, Powers and Faden's theory is an (E) combined with an (F). That is, their central concerns are to offer a quasi-empirical account of how structural injustice comes about and to put that account in the service of explaining why particular cases of injustice are in fact unjust. I infer that (E) is their ambition from such passages as when they identify the "central message" (56) of their theory as describing the "interactive process" (56) by which human rights violations and deprivations of well-being lead to structural unfairness and vice versa; similarly, they endorse a "brand of theorizing" (107) that appeals to a "richer vein of empirical discussion of how group-level efforts interact in morally problematic ways" (107). I infer that (F) is their ambition from passages such as this one: "In other words, our conception of well-being is used to explain why some unfair patterns of (dis)advantage are structurally unfair in the morally most urgent, most basic sense" (16). This integration of empirical diagnosis and normative assessment is, furthermore, what I take to be the point of their claim that they "offer a theory of justice that resembles the tradition of critical theory" (51).

Your theoretical ambitions may vary: this theory does not satisfy every possible interest in offering a theory of structural injustice, and should be exempt from criticism for not fulfilling aims that it doesn't have. One thing that is problematic, however, is that the authors interpret would-be competitors as having the same theoretical ambitions as they do. This makes for some strange readings of John Rawls and Iris Marion Young, for example. About Rawls, they write, "Some, like Rawls, presuppose the satisfaction of human rights as lexically prior to his principle of fairness" (3) and that he "assumes that concerns about disadvantage arise under conditions in which morally problematic power relations are absent" (19). They seem, that is, to take the lexical priority of the first principle to be somehow independent of fairness and a generalization of empirical conditions: basic liberties are always satisfied before distributive concerns are. Rawls's ideal of a well-ordered society would presumably be an empirical assumption, too. About Young, the authors write, "There are some similarities to Rawls in the way Young sets up the problem of how structural injustice emerges" (113, emphasis added). Young's approach, according to them, "assumes that individual decisions and transactions often involve no wrongdoing and that there is no particular unjust law or policy in place" (114). They take Rawls and Young to be offering (E)-and-(F)-type theories, and thus responsible for explaining how structural injustice emerges. And then Rawls and Young seem foolish, offering principles and claims of responsibility for a world in which no one is disadvantaged and racism and misogyny are not morally salient. But it is worth considering that different theoretical ambitions are in play with Rawls and Young. And it might be worthwhile to try to arrive at the fundamental principles of assessment for a just institutional structure of society, or to explain and legitimate concerns about structural injustice as a distinctive and urgent form of normative scrutiny that transcends the scrutiny we apply to individual interactions.

Another problem with the authors' theoretical ambitions is that they don't seem to understand them. They refer to their theory as grounded in fundamental interests or "core elements of well-being" (4), here, for example: "The interests that ground justice norms are especially important" (60). This makes it seem like a familiar (G)-type theory: norms of justice are grounded in a specification of the good and its legitimate distribution. But things appear differently as the theory is explicated:

In section 2.1, we begin by outlining how our conception of human well-being underpins our theory of structural injustice . . . First, our conception identifies unjust deprivations in the core elements of well-being . . . Second, our conception pinpoints patterns of structural disadvantage that are deeply and fundamentally unfair . . . Third, our conception highlights unfair power relations . . . (13)

Well-being only underpins the account of injustice if norms of unfairness and injustice are already in place; you need to already know how to apply "unfair" and "unjust" to see how well-being is relevant. So, well-being grounds justice norms about as much as social primary goods ground justice on Rawls's account. It tells you something about what the domain of normative controversy is, but not what the norms are.

Whatever the role of well-being in their theory, it seems to come with different specifications. For example, here are four of them. There is a sufficientarian and objective one: "our theory focuses on the most basic, fundamental matters implicating the core elements of well-being characteristic of a decent human life" (4). There is a subjective but universal one: "we are interested only in what anyone would want" (23). There is a more social one: things "assumed . . . to be among the things that anyone necessarily thinks of as having comparable value for everyone else" (24). Then there is a meta-level one: "our view, including our account of well-being, encapsulates and gives expression to what is centrally important to an array of social justice movements" (50). These four specifications of the conception of the good relevant for structural (in)justice could conceivably coincide in extension, but that would be unlikely.

I'm not sure why any of them are particularly suitable for a theory of structural (in)justice. A (G)-type theory would take this as a deep issue, pertaining to the nature of the social order and the basis of our claims upon it. Here I can only offer a few brief comments on some of these variations. The sufficientarian version results, I think, from the authors' non-ideal approach -- that they start from "the world as it is" (86), as they sometimes write. If your theory is built as a response to a pervasively unjust world, then the conditions for a "decent human life" are urgent demands. But one may wish to conceive of injustice as something that can obtain even in the context of a decent life, and justice as demanding more than the absence of unfair deprivations. With the third, more social version of conception of the good, we are perhaps led to think of a category of goods that are construed with regard to others' participation in a shared, cooperative existence. This by itself in unremarkable, but it is one of the few moments in which the authors move toward a political understanding of justice. The main concerns of justice, for them, are well-being, its deprivation through malign influence, and possible remedies. Some actors are states, some influence is carried out through exercise of power, and some deprivations are rights violations. But what matters is outcomes: "unjust effects on individuals" (85). Failures in democratic participation and decision-making are not themselves sources of injustice, except as they lead to "social structural impacts" (85). Justice, then, sometimes requires that something be done, while leaving how authority is contested and exercised as matters of subsidiary importance.

The meta-level specification of the good is an interesting one. It suggests a different way to understand the theoretical ambitions at stake here: the authors' aim, on this understanding, is to provide an articulation, in a suitably generalized form, of the theoretical commitments and evaluations that underlie the activities of social justice movements. One might say the aim is to provide a level of reflective self-awareness to movements that they themselves do not operate with; the theory expresses this deeper understanding. This is an interesting project, assuming that social justice movements do in fact have such underlying commitments. But it is not an account of structural injustice. I suspect that social movements are effective when they focus on their own claims and constituencies; there is no reason to think that the concerns of movements generalize into and track justice, and structural (in)justice in particular. If nothing else, movements require background conditions -- of popular solidarity, organizational leadership, and resources -- that are independent of the claims of justice. Movements aren't in the business of providing instances for theory.

The main question that this raises for me, however, is what the use of this kind of theory is. This is not a theory that provides fundamental principles, calls attention to particular structures, or legitimates the category of structural injustice. Indeed, the authors sometimes provide reasons why those forms of theory might be unattainable. But here is a theory that takes already-identified, already-analyzed injustices, which have already provoked organized resistance, and explains why they are wrong in terms that are more controversial and more complicated than those that are articulated within the movements themselves. Appeals to well-being, fairness, oppression, exploitation, and so on, are available without the framework of structural injustice. Activists and other practitioners have managed to advance their claims without appeal to a theory of structural injustice. So, what does the theory add, or what additional benefit does their or our possession of a theory convey? There are many valuable discussions in this book that I have not mentioned, such as the analyses of particular cases. But it escapes me what or whom the theory that they offer is for.