Structure and the Metaphysics of Mind: How Hylomorphism Solves the Mind-Body Problem

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William Jaworski, Structure and the Metaphysics of Mind: How Hylomorphism Solves the Mind-Body Problem, Oxford University Press, 2016, 361pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198749561.

Reviewed by William Seager, University of Toronto


Hylomorphism is the view that natural objects are in some way amalgams of two very different sorts of things: a formless substrate of wide potential and a structuring form which makes of the substrate whatever sort of thing the resultant object is. Form in some way unifies the substrate, transforming mere potentiality into full blown actuality. Thus an oak tree and a tiger are both made of the same kind of stuff (where 'stuff' has to be read in a metaphysically thick sense) and the vast differences between them lies in how they are formed (where 'form' must refer to a significant category of being). Hylomorphism is an ancient doctrine of course. It was the direct invention of Aristotle in an exercise of self-conscious metaphysics. The exact nature of Aristotle's theory remains to this day unsettled and the subject of much debate. The vast majority of work on hylomorphism is historical scholarship devoted to understanding Aristotle's views as well as the large body of derivative medieval philosophical and theological accretions. From a certain point of view hylomorphism is a dead doctrine. It was killed by the rise of a physical science which ostensibly appealed to nothing beyond efficient causation and violently rejected both 'substantial forms' and the idea that matter was 'mere potential'. According to a long tradition in modern science and philosophy, hylomorphism is nothing but obscure, even obscurantist, concept mongering.

There nonetheless has arisen a lively and growing strand of modern hylomorphism, more or less beholden to Aristotle but aiming not to present an historical analysis of a superannuated doctrine but rather a serious metaphysical position addressing current philosophical problems. Modern hylomorphists regard the recalcitrance of a range of philosophical problems, such as those of material composition and the mind-body problem, as symptoms of deep errors in the modern tradition which only the radical metaphysical reform promised by hylomorphism can address. While modern hylomorphism may offer promising answers to some pressing metaphysical worries it must struggle to dispel the cloud of obscurity and evident disconnection with the scientific outlook which bedevils the historical version, while avoiding collapse into a view merely verbally distinct from physicalism.

William Jaworski's book is a splendid addition to this revival of hylomorphism, notable for its clarity, thoroughness of presentation and depth of analysis. It resolutely advances an avowedly anti-physicalist view which deserves the hylomorphic label. Yet it also attempts to be entirely naturalistic in the sense that it 'accord[s] to empirical sources a privileged role in determining what exists, and it takes the sciences as paradigmatic examples of such sources' (p. 19). Jaworski spells out the details of a wide ranging metaphysical picture of the world which underpins his hylomorphism. He presents this picture by explicitly contrasting it with alternative views and does this in a way that is incidentally a wonderful guide to a host of views and arguments about substance, properties, modality and ontology. No matter what a reader's ultimate judgment about hylomorphism might be, this aspect of his book is an unalloyed success.

In bare outline the core of Jaworski's metaphysics is based on a substance-attribute ontology. Attributes or properties are not universals or abstract entities but tropes. That is, the redness, say, of a certain apple is a particular different from the redness of any other apple (tropes are, to speak in a conceptually backwards way if trope theory is correct, property instances). Tropes can be grouped according to similarity, which is a primitive notion not to be explained by invoking something which they all share. Ordinary talk of properties can thus be recast as talk about sets of appropriately similar tropes. One advantage of trope theory important for Jaworski's hylomorphism is that the particularity of tropes helps explain how properties figure in causal relations. This avoids the problems surrounding the metaphysical 'layering' of, say, causally impotent universals and their causally efficacious instances. It also helps to generate an interesting response to the problem of consciousness, as we shall see below. (There are lots of issues with trope theory and its relative advantages and disadvantages relative to other theories such as those that posit universals. Jaworski, as noted, provides a clear guide to the arguments here.)

The world is made of particular individuals (substances) possessed of tropes. What tropes are there? The answer stems from the claim that properties are particular causal powers. Jaworski endorses the so-called Eleatic principle (also known as Alexander's Dictum) that it is an essential feature of any property that it be able to causally initiate events (in concert with other properties). Jaworski expresses the principle through Plato's formulation: 'any thing has real being, that is so constituted as to possess any sort of power either to affect any thing else or to be affected'. However, he must intend the stronger claim. Otherwise traditional epiphenomenal properties could be real. Jaworski sees powers as always acting in reciprocal relations; there are no merely reactive powers.

Jaworski says that properties are few and far between.  They are 'sparse' and almost all predicative expressions fail to refer to properties. One particularly interesting place where sparseness arises is in determinable-determinate hierarchies. According to Jaworski, only fully determinate properties are real. Redness, say, is thus not a property. He advances several lines of argument for this strong claim, but a key one is that determinables are epiphenomenal. The argument is not unfamiliar: any time the redness of something causes an event, it is the fully determinate shade of red which does all the work. Now, one might wonder whether there aren't cases where something's being red is a better causal explanation of an event than that thing's being scarlet. But a deeper worry arises from the naturalism which Jaworski endorses. On this line of thought, it is not having a color property that causes things but rather the fully determinate physical states that govern reflectances. Any even fully determinate shade of red supervenes upon a vast number of underlying surface states that are all 'ways of being' that shade of red. This would seem to have the disturbing consequence that whatever we are aware of in experience, it is never properties.

On Jaworski's view, although properties are sparse, some of them characterize complex, composite individuals, genuine examples of which are also surprisingly rare in nature. The distinctively hylomorphic aspect of his theory arises from its account of what things count as such individuals. Individuals, that is true metaphysically bona fide things of which the paradigm example is a living organism, exist when their matter is appropriately structured (so structure is the analogue of or substitute for substantial form). Structure is a key concept for Jaworski and yet one that is difficult to define precisely. Jaworski provides a set of slogans outlining the role of structure:

Structure matters: it operates as an irreducible ontological principle, one that accounts at least in part for what things essentially are.

Structure makes a difference: it operates as an irreducible explanatory principle, one that accounts at least in part for what things can do, the powers they have.

Structure counts: it explains the unity of composite things, including the persistence of one and the same living individual through the dynamic influx and efflux of matter and energy that characterize many of its interactions with the wider world.

Structure minds: it provides us with resources for understanding the place of mental phenomena within the natural world. (p. 97, original emphasis)

A frequent, if grisly, illustrative example deployed by hylomorphists is that of the 'crushed human'. Jaworski's version goes like this:

Suppose we put Godehard in a strong bag -- a very strong bag since we want to ensure that nothing leaks out when we squash him with several tons of force. Before the squashing, the contents of the bag include one human being; after, they include none. In addition, before the squashing the contents of the bag can think, feel, and act, but after the squashing they can't. What explains these differences in the contents of the bag pre-squashing and post-squashing? The physical materials (whether particles or stuffs) remain the same -- none of them leaked out. Intuitively, we want to say that what changed was the way those materials were structured or organized. (p. 9)

Jaworski develops the notion of structure in great detail. In terms of his basic metaphysical picture, structure explains why certain composite individuals have particular properties, including powers which make a real causal difference in the world. Still, an obvious worry that arises when a hylomorphist replaces the philosophically heavyweight term 'form' with the much more anodyne 'structure' is that hylomorphism loses its distinctiveness and becomes, as Bernard Williams disparagingly called it, merely 'polite materialism'.

Jaworski devotes considerable effort to addressing 'Williams's Worry' because this seems to be a real problem for modern hylomorphism. No physicalist would hold that every feature of a physical system is necessitated simply by the properties of the fundamental physical entities, whatever they may be, ignoring the initial condition or the boundary conditions of the system. One might, for example, be able to predict that titanium is a possible element on the basis of the properties of quarks and electrons but whether any titanium exists in our world depends on the arrangement of the basic physical entities. Or again, is dynamical systems theory a kind of hylomorphism given that any dynamical system requires specification of an initial condition (the 'arrangement' of the relevant state parameters) to generate any behavior?

The worry here is that the notion of structure is much too weak to support the claim that hylomorphism is a distinctive metaphysical position. Structure is everywhere, but hylomorphic individuals are supposed to be rare. Indeed, Jaworski, following in fair measure lines of argument of philosophers such as Peter van Inwagen and Trenton Merricks, denies that most 'ordinary' objects exist. There are no bricks, tables, chairs, planets, etc. These mere aggregates have no powers of their own, their causal efficacy entirely devolves to that of their elementary parts. Jaworski makes much of his appeal to naturalism, pointing to the role of structure in modern science and most especially in biology. But it is far from clear that there is a principled distinction here.

In fact, beyond the linchpin case of living organisms, Jaworksi is reluctant to provide any examples of structured individuals. This ostensibly derives from deference to naturalism. Jaworski frequently avers that what individuals there are is a matter for empirical investigation by the relevant sciences. For example, when considering whether a molecule or an atom is a structured individual, he writes that 'if atoms and molecules have powers distinct from those which can be exhaustively described and explained by appeal to fundamental physical materials alone, then there are grounds for claiming that they are not mere aggregates of fundamental physical materials, but are distinctive individuals in their own right' (p. 108). Jaworksi takes no official stand on whether this explanatory project is possible and hence his catalog of hylomorphic individuals is always provisional and subject to revision.

While naturalistic deference may be a good thing, it leaves a distressing gap in hylomorphic metaphysics. Consider that in the science of geology the Earth is regarded as structured into interacting tectonic plates, by which hypothesis a great deal of geological activity and resulting terrestrial phenomena are explained. So is the Earth a hylomorphic individual? Presumably not. And presumably the reason must be that there is no 'explanatory unity' of the relevant kind. Yet it is hard to articulate exactly what makes for this unity. Which composite things persist in their identity over time in virtue of their structure?

To take an even simpler example, consider a triangle made of three steel rods attached by tight steel springs. This object has a structure (one cannot deduce from the properties of steel alone that this triangle will exist). It will preserve itself against outside forces (within limits, but that is also true of animal bodies). Is that enough to lend it hylomorphic 'unity'? Again, this is very doubtful.

In this case, it may be argued that the difference between the triangle and, say, a living human body is that there is no absolute need to invoke structure to explain the features of the triangle. But this is by any ordinary measure not true. The way the steel is arranged is crucial to how the triangle exists and persists. Perhaps the answer is that the explanatory function of this trivial sort of structure is reducible to nothing but the properties of the triangle's constituents and those constituents' inter-relations whereas the explanatory appeal to structure is in some way irreducible in the case of genuine hylomorphic individuals.

An important aspect of Jaworski's views is indeed the emphasis on irreducible explanatory principles, but the fact of this irreducibility cannot be known a priori. Hylomorphism is thus a hostage to scientific fortune. Jaworski allows that 'perhaps in the long run it will be possible to identify biological, psychological, and other higher-level structures with things that can be described exhaustively by physics, and in that case, hylomorphism will in fact turn out to be false' (p. 290). The consequences of this would be disastrous. Among these consequences would be that conscious beings would not be individuals and they would entirely lack their own causal efficacy. A disturbing consequence of this version of hylomorphism is that whether or not conscious beings such as ourselves so much as exist depends on the explanatory trajectory of physical science.

Furthermore, it is arguable on the basis of Jaworski's own commitments that the evil fortune has already come to pass. This is because his naturalism leads him to concede that all structure logically supervenes upon, or is necessitated by, the fundamental physical state of the world (see for example his discussion at pp. 283 ff.). When Jaworski holds that structure 'operates as an irreducible ontological principle' he does not mean to imply some kind of radical emergentism in which structures can exert some new force which directs matter to move in ways it otherwise would not (the denial of this kind of emergentism is supposed to be an important advantage of hylomorphism).

All of the so-called 'ontological' significance here rests upon explanatory irreducibility. Jaworski accepts supervenience and necessitation but denies that the fundamental physical state of the world determines everything else. What is the difference between necessitation and determination? Nothing but whether the subvenient base also serves to explain supervenient structure. It seems open to and reasonable for the physicalist to simply identify the hylomorphist's structured individuals with the necessitating base. Since Jaworski is open to the possibility of 'brute' or 'strong' necessities (the, to my mind, extremely dubious idea of absolutely necessary connections which are neither intrinsically intelligible nor reducible to other necessities), the physicalist's identification may be misguided, even given necessitation. But that is just the risk that the physicalist takes: physicalism might be false if, say, physical stuff happens to generate with absolute necessity some uncontroversially non-physical entities.

There is also an interesting issue lurking here that arises from diachronic as opposed to the synchronic dependency relations with which Jaworski is primarily concerned. Our best theories tell us that our world began about 13.772 billion years ago. Its early state might seem quite formless: some kind of quantum quark-gluon plasma without anything like ordinary matter present. But in order for the universe to have evolved into the world we currently observe, it must have been in a fantastically low entropy state which is tantamount to saying it must have been highly structured. Was the early universe a hylomorphic individual? It seems not since physics does seem quite capable of explaining this primordial structure entirely in terms 'nothing over and above what physics describes, and . . . nothing above the physical constituents of things and their physical relations' (p. 290). It must then be that at some time during the evolution of the universe there came a radical break -- a step into structures which are not so explicable in terms of basic physical features. Given Jaworski's adherence to physical necessitation, the existence of such a break seems very mysterious.

Even more mysterious, it seems to me, is the claim that these new structures have new powers inexplicable in physical terms even though they are fully necessitated by the basic physical properties of their constituents and their relations. Jaworski accepts that the laws of fundamental physics are never violated: 'higher-level behavior never violates lower-level physical laws' (p. 280). Non-violation and necessitation seem to imply that the world is physically causally closed. How then is it possible for there to be genuinely new powers causally at work in the world once structured individuals begin to appear? This is not the clearest aspect of Jaworksi's views but he appears to endorse a causal pluralism according to which 'explanations that appeal to reasons and explanations that appeal to physiological mechanisms pick out causal factors of different sorts' (p. 281). Perhaps reminiscent of Aristotle's 'four causes' pluralism, Jaworski allows 'physical' and 'rational' causes as distinct, non-overdetermining causes of events. However, it is hard to see that rational causes are 'new powers' as opposed to simply a cognitive explanatory gloss overlaid on purely physical processes which do all the causal work. At this point, the long-standing worry about the obscurity and even intelligibility of the hylomorphic approach threatens to reappear.

Hylomorphism generates an interesting approach to a number of aspects of the mind-body problem. There is space here only to look briefly at the problem of consciousness. One reason philosophers have gone looking for approaches beyond those vouchsafed by standard physicalism is the severe difficulties we have had integrating consciousness into the scientific physicalist picture of the world. Jaworski's hylomorphism aims to endorse the dual claims that phenomenal conscious states are absolutely necessitated by the subject's basic physical constitution and that physicalism is nonetheless false. Again, the logical space for this position depends on a very strong reading of physicalism which is that everything is explicable in basic physical terms without mention of structure. We have already discussed the explanatory side of Jaworski's hylomorphism so let's look at whether hylomorphism offers a new approach to the problem of consciousness. Phenomenal consciousness is a real thing and does not seem to be itself an individual so it must be a property, one of the structure-induced powers that genuine individuals possess. Various popular lines of argument suggest that phenomenal consciousness could vary across physically identical individuals. This sort of argument asks what it is about physical structure that makes it impossible for such modal variance to occur. Jaworski's theory has a straightforward answer to this question: all properties of individuals are absolutely necessitated by the physical properties of their constituents.

Why is this so? The hylomorphist holds, as few but substance dualists would deny, that our material constitution in the actual world, once structured into our human form, does support or generate phenomenal consciousness. Jaworski's trope-based view of properties as particular powers (or sets of powers) holds that wherever there are different powers there must be different properties. So any genuine duplicate of our world would have to duplicate its properties and hence its powers and hence in any such duplicate world consciousness would be generated once the appropriate material structures appeared. There is nothing particularly hylomorphic about this argument and it can be and has been advanced by thinkers from other schools of thought who endorse a metaphysics that identifies properties with powers. But it does dovetail nicely with Jaworski's naturalistic hylomorphism.

However, anyone who advances such a view will have to explain why there could not be another set of powers which share with the actual powers all the same basic physical features as outlined, say, in the standard model of physics and general relativity (a few basic kinds of matter, fields and the four forces of gravity, electromagnetism, plus the strong and weak nuclear forces) but which, when structured as a human being, fail to generate consciousness. In the absence of this explanation one is left with the suspicion that the problem of consciousness has only been 'solved' by conceptual fiat without giving us any understanding of the relation between the fundamental physical features of the world and consciousness. The talk of structures as embodying a novel 'ontological principle' remains especially mysterious in this case, and the old worries about the intelligibility and non-triviality of hylomorphism seem to return.

Jaworski is not unaware of these sorts of difficulties and my remarks barely skim the surface of his deep and thorough discussion of these and many more issues. His book will richly repay study by anyone interested in the mind-body problem and metaphysics in general.