Structures of Agency: Essays

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Michael Bratman, Structures of Agency: Essays, Oxford University Press, 2007, 321pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0195187717.

Reviewed by Mark Schroeder, University of Southern California


Structures of Agency is the second collection of Michael Bratman's papers, spanning essays published between 2000 and 2005 and thematically collected around the title question about how human agency is structured.  Its contents appeal to someone of my philosophical sensibilities -- Bratman aims, on the whole, not to insist on what is deep or special about human agency, but to explain it, and to do so by appeal to modest means.  Just as Bratman's earlier planning theory of intention (Bratman [1987]) is aptly described as, as he puts it, 'a modest theory of the will', the essays in this volume seek to show how a very simple way in which we can come to form intentions or policies about our own deliberation can play a fundamental role in solving a wide array of the problems in the theory of action that have occupied others while Bratman was developing his views about intention.  Among the key issues in play are autonomy, free will, self-governance, agential authority, identification, value judgment, and their relationship to self-reflection and to hierarchical conceptions of the will.

The driving idea behind most of the essays is simple, and appeals to Bratman's planning theory of intention.  Intentions, Bratman holds, are parts of plans, whose role in our psychic economy is to serve as tools of cross-temporal organization and coordination.  As tools of cross-temporal organization and coordination, they therefore play a central role in the Lockean conditions of our identity over time, which consist precisely in such continuity and coordinative relations between our future and past selves.  Bratman's main idea is that if intentions play such an important role in the Lockean conditions of our identity across time, that will suit them particularly well to play a role in explaining how reflective exercises of agency can involve self-control.  The idea is that when your intentions play a role in controlling your desires, it is you who are in the driver's seat, because given their central role in the Lockean conditions of your identity over time, control by your intentions is best-suited to amounting to your control.

Of course, not just any intentions will suffice for our control -- for example, it is possible to form intentions akratically, and to feel alienated from the resulting actions.  So the kinds of intention to which Bratman appeals, as having an especially central role in the Lockean conditions of our identity across time, are what he calls self-governing policies.  A policy, in general, is a general plan for what to do in certain kinds of circumstances -- a plan that settles, in general, what to do, and following which leads one to act in a principled way.  Because policies are general, rather than particular, they are best suited of intentions to play a role in constituting who we are.  Self-governing policies are policies about how to weight various considerations in deliberating about what to do.  Because Bratman thinks that self-governance, strictly speaking, must be connected with features of reason-responsiveness, he holds that if policies about how to weight considerations in deliberation play a central role in our psychologies, then that could explain why we have the capacity for self-governance, in this sense.

To take a central example, Bratman holds that this picture solves Watson's [1975] key worries about the Frankfurtian [1988] hierarchy of desires, yielding a view with many of the advantages of Frankfurt's, yet without succumbing to many of its flaws -- and all built out of an independently motivated framework.  In Frankfurt's original article, self-control derives from the exercise of second-order desires that one's first-order desires be or not be effective.  But Watson worries:

Since second-order volitions are themselves simply desires, to add them to the context of conflict is just to increase the number of contenders; it is not to give a special place to any of those in contention.  (Watson [1975, 218])

Bratman thinks this is right -- a hierarchy merely of desires wouldn't explain why it is that some particular level of the hierarchy especially deserves to count as what the agent really wants.  Bratman's hierarchical model is supposed to solve this problem.  In Bratman's picture, one level of the hierarchy does especially deserve to count as what the agent really wants: it is the level that is supported by the agent's self-governing policies.  It deserves to count as what the agent really wants, because due to the role of intentions and of policies in particular in cross-temporal organization and coordination, these policies play an especially central role in the Lockean conditions of identity over time, and hence have the best claim to help in constituting who you are.

One possible worry about this central idea of Bratman's is that it relies heavily on an implicit Lockean theory of personal identity, a theory that receives very little elaboration by Bratman.  Why is it, for example, that continuity of intentions is more important than continuity of beliefs or desires?  Bratman answers this question in section 2.4.  What is important for Lockean connections across time is not psychological continuity, which beliefs and desires can attain just as well as intentions can.  It is psychological connections, which are underwritten by mental states whose very role requires shared reference across time.  Just as the very role of first-personal memory requires that it make reference to the self that is the very same self who underwent the remembered experience, in Bratman's view the very role of future-directed intention requires that it make reference to the very same agent as the later present-directed intention that is ultimately executed.  It is this cross-reference that Bratman calls connectedness, and is at the basis of privileged Lockean conditions of identity across time, as he understands it.

The same features which, according to Bratman, allow his account to explain features of human agency such as self-control, autonomy, and self-governance, he also holds help to solve the engineering problem we face as agents who are self-reflective, and hence who have concerns not only about what to do, but about what to want, even as we act on our wants in determining what to do ('Autonomy and Hierarchy').  Explaining this is supposed to be a tricky problem, for reasons which take us back to Watson's objections to Frankfurt.  According to Watson, one of the central problems is that in reasoning, we reason about the objects of our desires, rather than about our desires for them.  Yet second-order desires would seem to direct us to take into account their objects -- namely, our first-order desires. 

So at the center of Bratman's treatment of our capacity for self-reflective agency is the concern that the attitudes that control our actions on the basis of reflective scrutiny of our attitudes should not turn out to always require such scrutiny.  On the contrary, Bratman reasonably holds, the fact that we can step back and reflect on our agency does not entail that we are always stepped back and doing so, nor does it require that we must be stepped back and reflective, in order to be acting autonomously, in the way that we do when we are fully reflective.  Self-governing attitudes are, again, supposed to solve this problem. 

My worry about this is that I don't understand exactly how it is supposed to work.  According to Bratman,

Now, a self-governing policy that eschews my treating my desire for revenge as reason-providing in my motivationally effective practical reasoning will eschew practical reasoning of both sorts.  [170]

'Both sorts', here, refers to reasoning which explicitly takes my desire for revenge into account in deliberation, as in 'I desire revenge', 'Action A would promote revenge'; 'So I will A', in addition to reasoning which does not pay explicit attention to my desire, which Bratman represents as the reasoning: 'Revenge is a justifying consideration', 'Action A would promote revenge'; 'So I will A'. 

Yet I find this claim highly suspicious.  It looks like these two bits of deliberation take into account different considerations.  One takes into account a consideration about what the agent desires, whereas the other takes into account a consideration about what is a justifying consideration.  Even if my acceptance of 'Revenge is a justifying consideration' is merely an expression of, or product of, my desire for revenge, in taking it into account, I don't appear to be taking my desire into account, and hence I appear to be taking into account a different consideration altogether.  This makes it hard to see why a policy of not placing weight on my desire for revenge would eschew practical reasoning of the sort that doesn't take that consideration -- that I have that desire -- into account.  So I remain skeptical about whether Bratman has found a single structure capable of underlying autonomous action which can be both what underwrites our reflective agency and effective in Watsonian, non-self-reflective agency.

Another central line of inquiry throughout the book is the development of an account of a distinctive attitude of valuing which can account for our capacity to be, as he puts it, wholehearted pluralists.  Bratman is persuaded by Watson and others that central to the ideas of autonomy and self-governance is the idea that we act by the lights of what we value, rather than simply in response to one or another causal pressure.  Yet valuing cannot be a matter simply of believing to be good, or of perceiving as good, because in cases of personal connections, our valuings favor things we know to be of equal or lesser value.  Valuing also extends beyond our beliefs about what is good, as in cases of existential choice like that of Sartre's young Frenchman, between the Free French and his mother.

Again, Bratman's idea is that self-governing policies can explain the distinctive role of valuing.  If valuing the Free French over one's mother is a matter of having a self-governing policy of weighting the needs of the Free French over those of one's mother in deliberation about what to do, then that explains both why valuing can extend beyond our judgments of what is actually good, and why it is that our valuings play a central role in the generation of autonomous action -- a connection other accounts leave unexplained. 

Yet this account worries me, as well.  Though it is easy to see why valuings can easily and rationally outstrip our beliefs about what is good, it is not clear why this conception of valuings allows them to rationally conflict with our beliefs about what is good.  I may believe, for example, that the welfare of two other children exceeds the value of the welfare of my own child, and yet rationally value my own child's welfare more.  On Bratman's view, this consists in my having a self-governing policy to weight my own child's welfare more heavily in deliberation than the welfare of the other two children.  Yet it is not clear why this policy is not itself irrational, in the face of my recognition that their collective welfare is, objectively speaking, more important.  Perhaps for a clue to the answer, we will have to look back to a similarly structured situation considered in Bratman's earliest work on means-end coherence of intention (Bratman [1981]).

On the whole, Bratman's strategy in the book is constructive, rather than argumentative.  If you remain unsatisfied, as I sometimes am, with standard statements of the problems for which philosophical theories of autonomy and self-governance are supposed to provide a solution, Bratman's approach does not put you into these debates on the ground floor, and so you may remain unsatisfied with the statement of what really needs to be solved.  But this is clearly intentional -- his purpose in these essays is to show how the tools in his basic account of intention can be put to work in order to provide elegant and novel solutions, with sparse commitments, to the problems that have vexed others -- as others have understood those problems.  If you demand proof that things must actually work as he proposes, you will again be unsatisfied.  But again, this is central to the essays' constructive project -- his aim is to show how these problems can be solved, and he is open to the possibility that other kinds of 'structures of agency' may be able to play similar roles.

I suspect, in fact, that one of the major sources of tension in the essays as they stand lies in the sometimes implicit background assumption that it will be a single, more complex, structure of agency, which underwrites all of these phenomena to whose explanation Bratman seeks to contribute: autonomy, self-governance, reflective agency, identification, value judgment, and the rest.  It is this implicit assumption that drives the concern that the very structure that underlies our capacity for reflective agency must also be at work in our non-self-reflective agency -- whose solution I took issue with, above.  I think it is again at work in the idea that valuings -- the very states which outstrip our judgments about what is good -- must also both play a role in an account of autonomous action and be distinct from ordinary first-order desires and intentions.  And this was the source of my second worry, above.  In contrast, I would suggest that once Bratman has given us the pieces to work with, there may be many and diverse structures of agency at work, playing a variety of distinct and perhaps overlapping roles -- and that we should not be tied down, in understanding these phenomena, to the expectation that they will fit into a single structure.

Structures of Agency presents a systematic and enlightening take on a wide variety of issues at the center of the philosophy of action in the last three decades, from plausibly the most systematic and important contemporary philosopher of action.  The essays overlap significantly in content, which makes the volume repetitive in places, but each contributes a distinctive angle.  It is required reading for anyone interested in any of these central debates in the philosophy of action, and for the deeper picture it presents of Bratman's comprehensive theory of human action.


Bratman, Michael [1981].  'Intention and Means-End Reasoning.'  Philosophical Review 90(2): 252-265.

Bratman, Michael [1987].  Intentions, Plans, and Practical Reason.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Frankfurt, Harry [1988].  The Importance of What We Care About.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Watson, Gary [1975].  'Free Agency.'  Journal of Philosophy 72: 205-220.