­Structuring Mind: The Nature of Attention and How it Shapes Consciousness

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Sebastian Watzl, ­Structuring Mind: The Nature of Attention and How it Shapes Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2017, 352pp., $70.00, ISBN 9780199658428.

Reviewed by Nicholas Silins, Cornell University


Your plane is landing and soon the din begins, as the phones emerge from their doze with a chorus of chirrups and beeps. As Sebastian Watzl reminds us in his opening pages, our attention is one of the most valued commodities of our times, sought by ever so many notifications, pop-up windows, billboards, and brands. While the austere format of NDPR is free of such grabs for our attention, elsewhere online lurid ads will try to inform you about how to burn belly fat like crazy or why you should never shop on Amazon again after seeing this site.

Watzl positions his book partly as a metaphysical project to understand what it is that companies so desperately seek to attract. He also has a phenomenological project to understand what it is like for us to attend, with an extensive analysis of the role of attention in structuring our conscious perspectives, ultimately arguing for the striking conclusion that a conscious mind without attention is impossible.

In what follows I'll summarize Watzl's project and his execution of it, with some queries about the details of his discussion. I'll close with bigger picture considerations about his book and its relation to other books on attention.

In part 1, Watzl carefully articulates and defends his answer to the question, "what is attention?" His answer in brief is that attention is a mental action of yours, the activity of structuring your mental states so that some are more central or prioritized, and others more peripheral. On this approach, strikingly, it is a mistake to think of attention as one among other functions of your mind. Instead, we should think of attention as stacking your mental states into hierarchies, whether those mental states be perceptual or cognitive or conative or something else.

To clear space for his view, Watzl begins by arguing against reductionist approaches to attention (chapter 1). His strategy is a posteriori, largely using empirical evidence that attention cannot be identified with any very specific neural process or mechanism such as working memory or biased competition processing, each of which seem to sometimes occur in the absence of attention. Also, he surveys the range of neural or computational processes that do occur in the presence of attention, and argues that there is no further way to give a unifying "low-level" account of what makes it the case that they occur with attention.

Watzl then develops the initial positive thesis that attention is a kind of subject-level mental action. He argues that the thesis makes sense of the otherwise puzzling passive yet active character of perception -- what we perceive is not up to us, and yet agency can still seem involved in perception. Watzl's (and others') reconciliation is that while hearing and seeing and the like are indeed passive, listening and looking and the like are themselves active, and themselves are forms of attending. Here attending is something we can directly control in ordinary circumstances, and even intentionally control provided we have the requisite concepts (chapter 2). He goes on to give a rich account of the ontology of activity, with a focus on the temporal structure of attention as a process, and an analysis of the role of our mental states in guiding that process (chapter 3).

Watzl next moves from general ontology to scrutinize what is specific to attending as a mental activity, namely, prioritizing some parts of our mind over others. He gives a careful analysis of the "priority structures" into which our attention structures our mental lives, with discussion of their elements and the quasi-formal principles of their generation. His picture is meant to explain how attention can be unified across such different cases as auditory attention, tactile attention, and intellectual attention. It is also meant to explain how attention is always dependent on some further mental state -- you cannot attend to an object without being in some distinct mental state directed towards the object, e.g., you cannot attend towards the pop-up ad without, say, seeing it or thinking about it (chapters 4, 5). He closes with a nice discussion of the functional role of prioritizing, arguing that the role of prioritizing is to organize information rather than to serve as a bottleneck to protect our limited capacity to process information. On this picture, the more information we can process, the more we need attention, not less -- as Gary Lupyan vividly puts it, an earthworm does not need attention more than we.

My first line of query centers on Watzl's key explanatory notion of a priority relation, of which he rejects a reductionist account. To respond to those seeking such an account, he points out that most of us can cope without a reductionist understanding of important notions such as that of knowledge. I am not sure Watzl is entitled to use the analogy, given the technical sense in which he uses "priority". If I attend to a task I see as trivial while procrastinating on something I regard as more important, I am not "prioritizing" the trivial task in an ordinary sense. Indeed, the dictionary definitions Watzl quotes on p. 71 describe priorities in terms of what "we think to need attention", not in terms of what actually receives our attention.

There is a further technical question about whether the priority relation is transitive. First, some stage setting about why the question matters. If the relation is not transitive, it follows that the distribution of priority relations between your mental states cannot be fixed by their intrinsic features, as "Absolutism" would have it (p. 98). Instead, we will have a "Relationalism" on which the sameness of priority relations between two subjects entails their overall sameness with respect to their levels of attention. As Watzl admits, this view will allow for odd scenarios, e.g. where you gradually nod off while watching a middling murder mystery without any gradual decrease of your level of attention to it. On Relationalism, your level of attention has not changed since you have not shifted your attention elsewhere and the overall hierarchy of your priorities has not changed (p. 98).

Watzl himself allows for the non-transitivity of the priority relation and defends Relationalism. He questions transitivity with apparently possible examples, say where you prioritize your work over your friends, and your friends over your workouts, and yet your workouts over your work. He blunts the oddity of Relationalism partly by suggesting that the strike against it relies on shaky "abstract" intuitions that vary according to one's philosophical background theories, and also by sketching some redescriptions of the odd cases (pp. 98-9).

I am inclined to say that my level of attention goes down as I nod off, but I would call this a phenomenological observation rather than an "abstract" intuition. I also doubt many people have rarefied theoretical presuppositions that would bias them here. Given Watzl's stated suspicion of intuition, he also may not be entitled to rely on his own work/friends/workouts case, in particular given the divergence of his use of "priority" in his theory-building from the ordinary use of priority.

The main issue here is perhaps that, without more of a foundational gloss on what the priority relation is, questions of its transitivity and its overall role will be hard for some readers to fully understand, let alone answer. That said, other readers might hop more smoothly on board, or at any rate become fluent with the notion after working through the rich theory Watzl uses it to build.

Returning now to the overview of the book, Watzl completes his metaphysical project by shifting to dynamics, examining two fundamentally different ways that your priority structures can change.

First, consider how your attention might be commanded by a sudden siren, or the popping up of a window on your screen or a notification on your phone. In such broadly "passive" cases, Watzl argues that attention remains an activity of ours, even guided by us, just not an activity under our control. His more detailed analysis develops an account of psychological salience, and extends recent work on pain by Colin Klein and Manolo Martínez to the case of attention, also integrating recent work on imperatives in the philosophy of language. On the striking view Watzl develops in chapter 6, your conscious or unconscious perception of the text alert quite literally commands you to prioritize it: here is a loud chime, prioritize me! (This raises the question of what happens in cases where you do perceive the same stimulus, but it does not succeed in attracting your attention).

Second, contrast how you might direct your attention by exercising control, as when you intentionally wrest your attention away from the notification that just grabbed it. These "active" cases are the topic of chapter 7. Here Watzl develops a series of analogies with the case of intentional bodily action, zooming in from deliberation and choice to action plans, then all the way to fine-grained motor intentions.

In the second half of the book, Watzl executes the phenomenological portion of his project, examining the relation between attention and consciousness. He begins by analyzing what it is like for us to attend, and starts by arguing for a negative thesis: the character of our perceptual attention is not exhausted by the character of how things perceptually appear to us. In particular, two people might be the same with respect to how things perceptually appear to them, and yet different with respect to what it is like for them to attend. While attention does sometimes modulate how things appear to us, what it is like for us to perceptually attend cannot be captured by this role (chapter 8).

On the appearance view of perceptual attention opposed by Watzl, any difference of perceptual attention between two subjects entails a difference in how the world appears to those subjects. For example, perhaps attention increases the level of determinacy of the properties we perceive, so that differences in perceptual attention entail differences in the level of determinacy of properties perceived.

Against the appearance view, Watzl argues that any supposed effect of attention on appearance can be obtained without attention, so that we will always be able to duplicate the appearances in an episode of attention, while varying the presence of attention in it. To To use an example from Marisa Carrasco, if you covertly attend to a patch of 22% contrast while fixating elsewhere, the patch will appear to have 28% contrast. But we can duplicate the appearances presented in the covert attention scenario by having you perceive an unattended patch that actually is of 28% contrast (p. 173). 

While Watzl's strategy is fascinating, I query whether it is empirically sound. The strategy seems to assume that, in any case where attention alters the appearance of the world, we can always achieve the same appearance by making a suitable adjustment to the world. To mention another example, if attending to the piano makes it sound a little louder, compare listening without attending to a louder piano (p. 173). But perhaps some adjustments to the world are not perceivable without attention. For instance, there may be fine-grained properties that we can perceptually represent only by overtly attending to them -- they are of too fine a resolution for us to perceive without foveation and attention. At least as a matter of contingent fact, some appearances might then not be duplicable without a duplication of attention. To put the challenge differently, Watzl may beg the question against his opponent, by assuming that attention is not necessary for the presentation of any appearances (for a more abstract argument of his that might avoid the challenge, see pp. 173-181).

Having argued for the negative thesis that the appearance view is false, Watzl goes on to develop his positive view of what it is like for us to attend. His strategy is to take the rich metaphysical picture developed in the first half of the book, and to trace out how the facts captured by the picture are manifested in consciousness. He in effect holds a phenomenological mirror to his earlier analyses of priority relations, imperatival content, and of the dynamics of our agency in attention (chapters 9-11). By drawing on accounts of agentive awareness of action, he reaches the striking payoff of an account of how we introspectively access our attention, as well as a discussion of the limits of the knowledge our agentive awareness can provide (chapter 12).

Watzl closes the book with a nice, empirically astute discussion of whether consciousness is necessary or sufficient for attention. Most dramatically, he makes a bold move forward in the debate by arguing that there cannot be a conscious mind that does not have attention (potentially shifting to a somewhat more general question). His strategy is to defend the claims that consciousness is unified, perspectival, and subjectively accessible, and then to argue that these features of consciousness are best explained by the view that subjects are conscious only if their consciousness is structured by attention. It is remarkable how he manages to weave within the intricate back and forth of empirical debates about inattentional blindness or unconscious attention, and then leap back out to the maximally general question of the nature of consciousness. Much work in the area at best does one or the other, and Watzl takes up both approaches at their best.

As Watzl mentions in the opening of his book, work by philosophers on attention has recently begun to thrive. While his engagement with cognitive science and neuroscience seems highly competent and creative, readers seeking a broader overview of the science of attention might be best served by a work such as Wayne Wu's Attention. On my reading, Watzl's book stands out from recent books in the field thanks to his engagement with broader work in philosophy. While interdisciplinary, his book is also deeply "inter-sub-disciplinary" (to use a hefty term from Ralph Wedgwood). Watzl makes informed and insightful use of work from not just cognitive science and the philosophy of mind, but also metaphysics, ontology, the philosophy of action, and the philosophy of language. Further, he engages with work outside the analytic tradition in Western philosophy, including Sartre, Husserl, and the Husserlian Gurwitsch (the latter two discussed extensively by Carolyn Dicey Jennings).

Watzl's unifying and systematic approach stands out for its ambition. One upshot is that the book has many moving parts, some understandable only in relation to each other and their roles in his overall project. This is all for the good of the resulting intricate picture, but be advised that some of this content is not snackable.

A risk of Watzl's unifying approach is that of underestimating the diversity of attention. While the idea that attention involves prioritizing is highly intuitive at first glance (setting aside the complication of what "priority" exactly means here), the approach is arguably most at home in cases where we control the direction of our attention. But when our attention is grabbed by a sudden bang, it is not so clear that we ourselves are prioritizing. While Watzl is right to remind us that our actions include phenomena such as absent-minded tapping of our feet, some cases of exogenous attention shifts might seem more like our limbs being moved for us rather than by us. Further, the cases of unconscious attention he carefully documents in chapter 12 might stretch the notion of prioritizing too far beyond its home.

While Watzl opens with arresting examples of how our attention is commodified and sought, he does not return to such phenomena. Given the pervasive role he assigns to attention in structuring our mental lives, he more than makes good on his promise to help explain why attention matters. In order to go further, we presumably need to look at roles of attention beyond our individual mental lives, bringing in broader social, ethical, and political perspectives. In any case, given the foundational role attention plays in our mental lives, it is no surprise that so much of the social media and attention-sucking apps out there are nominally free. Given the value of our attention as analyzed by Watzl's meticulous and rewarding work, Facebook and its ilk should be paying us.


Thanks to Susanna Siegel for comments on this review.