Studies in Buddhist Philosophy

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Mark Siderits, Studies in Buddhist Philosophy, Jan Westerhoff (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2016, 313pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198754862.

Reviewed by Charles Goodman, Binghamton University


This volume collects nineteen essays by Mark Siderits, a scholar many have come to see as the world's leading expert on Indian Buddhist thought and its relevance to contemporary philosophy. It is dense, sophisticated, and sometimes quite difficult; and it draws on a remarkable range of sources. As this book is in no way an introductory text, philosophers who are unfamiliar with South Asian intellectual traditions would be better advised to consult Jay Garfield's excellent Engaging Buddhism or Siderits' own Buddhism as Philosophy. But for those with an interest in Buddhist thought, the collection is of great value. Siderits takes us on an illuminating and informative tour of ancient debates that to many may have seemed both dated and obscure; and from these debates, drawing on his remarkable knowledge, imagination and insight, he is often able to help us learn real philosophical lessons.

The book is organized into six parts, each of which consists of several previously published essays. These essays are presented in their original form, but have been supplied by the author with useful new postscripts that often qualify some of their claims and relate their themes to Siderits' current views. The volume also includes a valuable introductory essay by the editor, Jan Westerhoff, himself an acclaimed scholar and interpreter of Buddhist philosophy.

Due to his deep knowledge of the various forms of non-Buddhist Indian thought, extending across the full range of Indic traditions, and especially due to his mastery of Nyāya texts, Siderits has the ability to place the views and arguments of Buddhist philosophers into their full intellectual context, illuminating their intended meaning and offering glimpses of what they might mean to us. And Siderits is sensitive to the ways in which cultural differences between premodern India and the various phases of Western society shaped which philosophical questions seemed interesting or urgent to the philosophers working in those contexts.

This book extends careful examination to the full range of Indian Buddhist thought, including in its scope the reductionist realism of the Abhidharma, the idealism of Yogācāra, and the profound doctrine of emptiness found in the Madhyamaka. Siderits has a unique ability to understand and express the intuitive appeal and the intellectual strengths of both realist and anti-realist traditions of Buddhist philosophy. His discussions of Abhidharma teachings are especially valuable. Abhidharma texts often seem forbidding and inaccessible to modern Western readers, as their intellectual agenda is quite foreign to ours. Siderits is masterful in showing how these texts' questions overlap with our questions, thus providing us with ways in which we might begin to learn from their answers.

Part 1 focuses primarily on Madhyamaka, the most prestigious and influential form of Buddhist philosophical reflection to emerge from the Indian tradition. Siderits' sophisticated interpretations of Madhyamaka draw extensively on modern analytic authors such as Quine and Putnam. Through the postscripts, the reader can learn how Siderits' understanding of the thought of Nāgārjuna and other Madhyamaka authors has developed and deepened over time.

Several of the essays in Part 1 explain and defend aspects of Siderits' semantic interpretation of emptiness. Essay 1.3, in particular, responds to an important objection against this interpretation: namely, that it leaves no room for the role of the realization of emptiness in Mahāyāna Buddhist views of salvation. On this point Siderits' interpretation of the meaning of "suffering" in Buddhism (46) strikes me as overly restricted and thus implausible, but several other aspects of this discussion are valuable and well-motivated. (The rather different presentation of suffering at 269-70, while still incomplete, is, on my view, rather closer to the mark.)

Tibetan authors who write about Madhyamaka tend to criticize, and sometimes to caricature, the views of the tradition known as Svātantrika. But Siderits sees this school of thought as having valuable intellectual resources to prevent Madhyamaka thought from degenerating into a complete relativism. By finding important strengths in the Svātantrika position, Siderits shows his originality and his ability to raise powerful challenges against others' assumptions.

Part 2, the longest in the book, is quite diverse, with five essays covering a variety of topics. Among many valuable insights offered, I was especially struck by a point Siderits makes at 83 about the "person" that is the central distinctive posit of the marginal Indian Buddhist tradition known as Pudgalavādins or "Personalists." As he remarks, Indian philosophers who theorized about causation agreed that cause and effect must be either identical or distinct; but the Pudgalavādins denied that the "person" could be said to be either identical or distinct from physical and mental processes. Siderits points out that it seems to follow that the "person" should be causally inert. Given other Buddhist philosophical commitments, including the causal efficacy test for existence, such an admission would be very damaging to the Pudgalavādins' argumentative position.

Essay 2.4 intervenes in a thorny controversy about the role of contradiction in Madhyamaka thought. The piece provides strong reasons to resist the dialetheist reading of Nāgārjuna championed by such authors as Jay Garfield and Graham Priest. Essay 2.5 draws several careful distinctions that do much to clarify the relationship between the Indian concept of anumāna, usually translated as 'inference,' and logical and epistemological concepts that are more familiar to us.

Part 3, on the philosophy of language, presents some of the fruits of Siderits' extensive work on the crucial and difficult doctrine of apoha, or "exclusion," which is so central to Buddhist approaches to the problem of universals. Essay 3.1 offers a careful, clear technical explanation of apoha as Siderits understands it. Part 3 grows more intricate as it proceeds; readers of essay 3.3 will come away with a vivid appreciation for the level of complexity and sophistication attained by the philosophy of language in India, where both compositionality and the context principle were clearly recognized and extensively debated.

Most of Part 4 consists of Siderits' two ground-breaking and now classic essays, first published in 1980-81, that explore the Madhyamaka critique of pramāṇavāda epistemology. The first ten pages of this extended discussion offer an accessible, clear, and straightforward introduction to Nāgārjuna's full-spectrum attack on the epistemological enterprise. I have often taught this passage to undergraduates and found that it engages their interest and awakens their curiosity. As these two essays unfold, the discussion rapidly becomes deeper and more difficult; the reader will be invited to reflect carefully on the details of some thorny debates among Naiyāyikas, defenders of Madhyamaka, and Buddhist epistemologists.

Essay 4.3, "Madhyamaka on Naturalized Epistemology," relates Indian pramāṇavāda to contemporary Western epistemological discussions in fascinating ways. Here Siderits defends a surprising, controversial, and potentially very historically important claim: "that no party to the dispute over the number and nature of the pramāṇas held the internalist KK thesis" (238). Siderits' reading of the entire pramāṇa tradition as externalist is central to his respectful appreciation of that tradition and to his account of the lessons we might learn from it.

Essay 5.1 is a restatement of the view Siderits calls "paleocompatibilism." This view has played an important role in the development of what is now a substantial and growing literature on the relevance of Buddhist teachings to the problem of free will. Essay 5.2, meanwhile, presents Siderits' elegant interpretation of Buddhist ethics as 'aretaic consequentialism' and clearly explains his account of the relation between reductionist metaphysics and Buddhist ethics. As Siderits himself points out in his postscript, scholarly discussion of these matters has developed quite a bit since he wrote the essay. But I, for one, hold that there was quite a bit of truth in Siderits' initial contribution, and quite a bit of interpretive reasoning that has stood the test of time and argument.

Part 6 focuses on a theme that frequently recurs throughout the book: namely, the relations between Buddhist and non-Buddhist forms of Indian thought. Essay 6.1 carefully distinguishes between three distinct senses of the vexed term 'realism' and applies these distinctions in an interesting way to several Indian traditions. This essay is also noteworthy because it critiques a line of argument that had been presented in an influential earlier piece of Siderits', also reproduced in the volume.

Essay 6.2 tackles the important and widely discussed question of whether Madhyamaka and Advaita Vedānta hold genuinely different views, or whether they represent alternate routes to essentially the same conclusion. The latter view would lend support to some forms of perennialism, and has been popular among sincere spiritual seekers and teachers. However, Siderits marshals important evidence that the former view is the one that is correct. In the essay and postscript, Siderits identifies two fundamental differences between these two traditions, from which many other differences of detail could flow. These turn out to be, first, the Madhyamaka rejection and Advaita embrace of a thin, residual form of metaphysical realism; and second, the Madhyamaka use of the logical device of non-affirming external negation, which, Siderits holds, has no parallel in Advaita.

By comparing the essays and reading the postscripts, the reader will recognize Siderits' intellectual honesty, as manifested by his ability to change his mind as his understanding has deepened. Unfortunately the postscripts can be a bit repetitive. Moreover, given the complex ways in which Siderits' views have evolved over time, and the importance of this intellectual development for the interpretation of his thought, it would have been very helpful to this reader for the book to have provided a page collecting the bibliographic information for the initial publication of the various essays; or at least, for the dates of initial publication to have been noted in an accessible manner. But this information seems to have been omitted entirely from the volume.

Siderits' essays can be difficult and dry; as he himself openly admits, his efforts to bring large and highly disparate bodies of thorny and challenging texts into dialogue with each other have sometimes led him into philosophical errors. Nevertheless, these essays more than repay the effort required to engage with them. Collectively they represent perhaps the single most important effort yet made to build a world philosophy, one that would learn from the various great wisdom traditions of humanity while being at the same time highly respectful and searchingly critical of all sides in the conversation. The very incompleteness and tentativeness of much of Siderits' writing is an indication, not only of his own deep sincerity in tirelessly searching for the truth, but also of how much we all still have to learn from following the trail he has blazed for us.