Studying Human Behavior: How Scientists Investigate Aggression and Sexuality

Placeholder book cover

Helen Longino, Studying Human Behavior: How Scientists Investigate Aggression and Sexuality, University of Chicago Press, 2013, 256pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226492889.

Reviewed by Angela Potochnik, University of Cincinnati


Helen Longino initially planned for scientific approaches to studying human behavior to serve as an extended example of the pluralism addressed in her 2001 book, The Fate of Knowledge. That example instead became a book-length treatment of the variety of approaches to studying human behavior, especially aggression and sexuality. The themes that emerge from Longino's analysis are a continuing plurality of methods; a plurality even of the very conceptions of the phenomena under investigation; and the social dimensions of research uptake, which are particularly notable for the highly politicized behaviors of aggression and sexuality. Each of these themes will be to some degree familiar from Longino's 2001 book and related work, but they are here carefully developed from the ground up for the particular case study of the science -- or rather, the sciences -- of human behavior.

The book has two parts. In the first part, Chapters 2 through 7, Longino surveys a number of scientific approaches to studying human aggression and sexuality. Quantitative behavioral genetics employs the familiar tool of twin studies to compare the relative influence of genetic variation and environmental variation on behavioral variation in a population. Social-environmental approaches focus on establishing specific environmental influences on behavior. Molecular behavioral genetics, in turn, attempts to establish associations between specific genetic features and behavior. Neurobiological approaches focus on the neural correlates of behavior. Longino offers a briefer survey of integrative approaches, including developmental systems theory, dynamic systems theory, the GxExN approach, and multifactorial path analysis. Finally, she briefly introduces human ecology and ethology, which analyze differences among the behavioral patterns found in different populations. This last approach is introduced primarily in order to create a contrast with the other approaches, all of which analyze behavioral differences among individuals in a single population. For each of these scientific approaches, Longino surveys the methods employed, primary findings, necessary assumptions, and she details some examples of the research. For all approaches save human ecology and ethology, Longino also characterizes the main criticisms, though she emphasizes that her aim is not to evaluate the approaches, but simply to survey "the complexity of the research landscape" (p.15).

In the second part of the book, Chapters 8 through 11, Longino draws three main philosophical conclusions about these approaches to studying human aggression and sexuality. She thinks of the conclusions as epistemological, ontological, and social in nature. First, the epistemological conclusion concerns the relationship among the scientific approaches in question. In Chapter 8, Longino argues for a pluralism according to which each approach provides partial understanding, but the approaches resist integration and indeed are incommensurable with one another. She bases this pluralism on a careful accounting of the different ways the approaches parse the causal space, which is usefully depicted in a number of diagrams (Figures 1-8). Second, the ontological conclusion concerns the very phenomena under investigation, viz., how behavior in general and specific behaviors of interest are to be defined. Longino argues in Chapter 9 that specific behaviors are "multiply operationalized," that the very concept of behavior is both vague and ambiguous, and that proper definition depends on the cognitive and practical aims of the moment. Third, the social conclusion concerns differences in the uptake of aggression and sexuality research according to approach, both in research/professional literature and also in popular media. Based in part on citation analysis, Longino concludes in Chapter 10 that there is little uptake of research across approaches; that genetic research is overrepresented (and over-regarded) in popular media; and that the focus is solely on individuals' behavior, with population patterns wholly neglected.

I will focus on two topics in this review. The first regards the methodology of Longino's project, and in particular, the project's treatment of the scientific literature on human aggression and sexuality. Roughly half of the book is devoted to a careful analysis of scientific approaches to understanding these behaviors, including methodologies, assumptions, and criticisms of the approaches. Judging from the treatments of the approaches with which I am most familiar, Longino's analysis is thorough and accurate. (There is, of course, always room for disagreement on one or another specific point.) I am, however, unsure of the intended role for the specific research studies that Longino discusses. Are these intended as simply a few examples of each of the research approaches at issue? Are they supposed to be representative of the studies commonly done in these research areas? Or, are the studies discussed intended to provide a wide survey of existing research in each area? One would think that, given the specificity of this project's scope, the research discussed would include a fairly broad survey of the best exemplars of each approach. As far as I can see, Longino does not indicate how she has chosen the specific research she focuses upon, nor how broad of a survey it constitutes. I have some concern that, without an explicit principle governing the inclusion of research, conclusions based on the studies discussed may not be generally applicable. Granted, Longino attempts a much more thorough analysis of the science than do most projects in philosophy of science. I wonder, though, whether this also increases the standard for evidence.

A related concern arises for the citation analysis on which Longino bases her conclusions about the differential uptake of research. This is her third main point, developed in Chapter 10. Longino analyzed citation patterns for one or a few articles by a single author or a single set of authors in most of the approaches she considered. (It appears she did not analyze citation patterns for any work in molecular behavioral genetics, dynamic systems theory, or multifactorial path analysis.) For each, Longino considers citation patterns in the various research approaches and in clinical or policy applications. She also analyzes how this research is represented in popular media. As outlined above, Longino's main conclusions are that research is mostly cited by other research using the same approach; that genetic research is overrepresented in popular media; and that the focus is on individuals, with population patterns wholly neglected. These conclusions are certainly plausible. However, they go well beyond the evidential basis provided by the citation analysis. Consider that there is effectively a sample size of one -- viz. work by one author or set of authors -- for each approach being compared.

Again, the conclusions are plausible, and Longino acknowledges in a footnote that the citation analysis could have been more extensive (p.180). But basing comparisons on a sample size of one means that the observed differences could have been due to any number of variables besides the approaches used by the researchers. For example, Longino supports her conclusion that behavioral genetics receives much more attention in the popular media by comparing the attention received by Steven Pinker's The Blank Slate, taken to represent the behavioral genetics approach, with the attention received by books representing other approaches.[1] Pinker's book was reviewed much more widely than any of the others. But comparing this handful of books only supports the conclusion that something about Pinker's book resulted in much greater uptake by the popular media. Perhaps this is because of the book's focus on genetics, as Longino suggests. Alternatively, it may be due to differences in the scholars' reputations, their track record with previous trade publications, the flashiness of their titles, the presses publishing the books, the promotion budgets for the books, or any number of other differences. A comparison among only a handful of books cannot possibly distinguish among these possibilities.

The second topic I will focus upon is more philosophical; it regards the pluralism that Longino advocates for the scientific study of human behavior. This is her first main point; it is developed in Chapter 8. Longino is not very explicit about what sort of monism or pluralism is at stake in her discussion, but with a little interpretive work, it emerges that she is advocating what one might call a methodological pluralism. Longino characterizes this view as follows:

From an empirical point of view, what we know is piecemeal and plural. Each approach offers partial knowledge of behavioral processes gleaned by application of its investigative tools. In applying these tools, the overall domain is parsed so that effects and their potential causes are represented in incommensurable ways. We can (and do) know a great deal, but what we know is not expressible in one single theoretical framework. (p.144)

At the same time, she says, "we may remain metaphysically committed to the view that multiple factors or processes are interacting in our one world" (p.146-7). Longino's pluralism is thus compatible with what we might call metaphysical monism, viz., belief in what she calls one world, and a fact of the matter about causal factors and how they interact. The pluralism is posited at the level of representation, corresponding to different approaches to understanding this world.

Longino is clear that this pluralism is enduring. She argues against the view that a subset of approaches is superior to the others, and she argues that any attempt to integrate the approaches is futile. My first concern with Longino's pluralism arises here. Why think that integration of any sort is not possible? Indeed, why not think that the current array of approaches is in some sense integrated? Longino successfully argues that the various accounts of human aggression and sexuality cannot be stitched together like a patchwork quilt, offering a unified account of these phenomena. Instead, "the scientific knowledge of human behavior that results from these multiple types of investigation will remain piecemeal, kaleidoscopic" (p.206). A kaleidoscope is a terrific metaphor here. Longino continues,

The completeness we see through a kaleidoscope is an illusion achieved through mirrors and the obscuring of alternative configurations. There are actual relations among the elements, but the structure of the kaleidoscope prevents their being fully perceivable, suggesting only, as we turn the instrument, that there are multiple ways of perceiving them. Understanding the image produced requires appreciating its partiality. (p.206)

Understanding an image produced through a kaleidoscope does require appreciating the image's partiality. But one might argue that a deeper, more complete understanding results from turning the kaleidoscope in a full rotation and viewing, in turn, each of the images that forms. Perhaps a patchwork quilt is simply the wrong metaphor for integration; Longino successfully argues against the possibility of a single, complete model of human behavior. But the range of approaches that she describes and the systematic differences among them seem to provide a well-integrated, kaleidoscopic view of the phenomena, not a hodgepodge of methods with unprincipled and irreconcilable differences. Fully developing this idea requires more space than I have, so I will leave this as the suggestion that Longino may not be undermining any hope of integration so much as offering a new account of integration.

I have a second, distinct concern about the pluralism that Longino advocates. It seems as if it does not allow room for the critical evaluation of an approach. Several times Longino suggests that if a scientist or philosopher criticizes a scientific approach, then the individual in question is a monist (e.g., p.125, 138). Yet one may be a methodological pluralist and still find fault with one or another methodological approach. Two examples come to mind. First, as Longino documents in Chapter 2, quantitative behavioral genetics has been thoroughly criticized for a variety of methodological issues, as well as for conclusions that regularly outstrip their evidential basis. A particular approach like quantitative behavioral genetics may be methodologically flawed -- even to the point of warranting its abandonment -- without threatening methodological pluralism. Second, as mentioned in Chapter 4, molecular behavioral genetics has been criticized for its lack of illuminating results. Longino summarizes the problem as follows:

Each gene related to a polygenic trait may raise the probability of a given phenotype by only a slight amount . . . Moreover, environmental factors within and outside the organism may play larger roles in the incidence of a phenotypic trait than genetic sequence alone. Genetic methodologies . . . will not find those factors. (p.59)

A particular approach may prove empirically fruitless without threatening methodological pluralism. Indeed, this just may be the case for the molecular genetic approach to human behavioral traits like aggression and sexuality. Molecular genetics may often be the wrong place to look for the causal basis of such behaviors.

There is a deeper problem related to this concern about the relationship between critical evaluation of an approach and Longino's pluralism. Namely, there is a tension between Longino's pluralism, with its commitment to multiple, incommensurable approaches, and her suggestion that there should be much more uptake of research findings across approaches. I have already surveyed methodological pluralism and the incommensurability it posits. The divergence among approaches is only heightened by Longino's second main finding, that behaviors are defined differently by different approaches. On the other hand, Longino criticizes the lack of interaction across approaches and its results, including no reevaluation of an approach, the limited effectiveness of peer review, and little attention paid to what the knowledge gained by an approach is knowledge of (p.207). This accords with Longino's (2001) emphasis on the importance of the uptake of criticism from other epistemic communities in the production of knowledge. This is an uncomfortable resting point. Longino has argued for the continuing importance of multiple, incommensurable approaches, and yet urges greater interaction among those same approaches. Incommensurability suggests inability for one approach to speak to another, and on the other hand, interaction among approaches suggests the integration that Longino dismisses.

In this review I have discussed just a couple of topics in Longino's careful, insightful treatment of the sciences of human behavior. There is, of course, much more to consider. Overall, this book offers a useful overview of a number of scientific approaches to investigating human behavior and a thorough examination of the existing concerns with each approach. Longino's treatment of the different ways these approaches parse the causal space is illuminating for those interested in the sciences of human behavior, and also as a case study of how multiple approaches address a phenomenon in very different ways that are not easily reconcilable. The philosophical analysis brings to bear on this specific corner of science Longino's (2001) account of pluralism and the social dimensions of knowledge production.

[1] The books compared with Pinker’s The Blank Slate are Matt Ridley’s Nature via Nurture, Richard Lewontin’s The Triple Helix, Dean Hamer and Peter Copeland’s Living with Our Genes, Anne Fausto-Sterling’s Sexing the Body, Jonathan Pincus’s Base Instincts, and Susan Oyama’s Ontogeny of Information (2nd Ed.).