Subjective Consciousness: A Self-Representational Theory

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Uriah Kriegel, Subjective Consciousness: A Self-Representational Theory, Oxford UP, 2009, 333pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199570355.

Reviewed by Joseph Levine, University of Massachusetts, Amherst


Consciousness is a hot topic these days, what with online conferences, associations for its scientific study, and the like, and Kriegel’s book is squarely in the middle of this ferment. Kriegel’s aim is to provide a comprehensive theory of phenomenal consciousness. As a lot of what I have to say will be critical, let me state up front that in many ways I really like the book. For one thing, it combines an impressive attention to the empirical side of the matter with a genuinely philosophical treatment. And though the book is quite long, it reads easily and is not repetitive. There are new ideas and arguments in every section, far too many to survey and evaluate here. And though I find some of the arguments unconvincing and ill-considered, with Kriegel the rule is: you don’t like that one, well I have three more for you to consider. The question is, what does it all add up to? So let me proceed to try to answer that question by first providing an overview of the main line of argument of the book. Kriegel has a complicated story to tell, so bear with me, as even a brief presentation of it can’t be brief enough. I’ll do my best.

We begin with a distinction that I myself emphasized in Levine (2001). Consider a paradigm conscious experience, such as the one you have when looking at a ripe tomato in daylight. What seems to be distinctive of this mental state as a conscious experience can be divided into two components: what Kriegel calls its “subjective character” (I called it “subjectivity”) and its “qualitative character”. One way to get at the distinction is by way of the standard “what it’s like” locution. When we say that there is something it is like for me to see a ripe tomato on the kitchen counter in daylight, that there is something at all it is like for me is the subjective character, and precisely what it is like for me is the qualitative character. All conscious experiences share subjective character, but they differ in their qualitative character.

Phenomenal consciousness, according to Kriegel, is that feature of mental life that is responsible for the “explanatory gap” (Levine 1983) and the “hard problem” (Chalmers 1996). While most philosophers have grappled with qualitative character, Kriegel argues that it is really subjective character that is at the heart of the problem. Still, as phenomenal consciousness is composed of both kinds of character, and he seeks a fairly comprehensive theory of phenomenal consciousness, Kriegel provides an account of qualitative character alongside his principal account of subjective character.

Kriegel’s theory is called the “self-representational” theory of phenomenal consciousness. Subjective character is that feature of a conscious state by virtue of which there is something it is like for the subject. But being “for the subject”, according to Kriegel, means being something of which the subject is aware. Kriegel defends this claim by way of defending the “ubiquity thesis”, the thesis that every conscious state is a state of which we are aware. Once we grant this, we then need to analyze “awareness”, which, according to Kriegel, is best understood in terms of representation. As will become clear by the end of this review, it is this move that I believe leads to all the problems. Kriegel rightly notes that analyzing awareness in terms of representation is a substantive hypothesis, and defends it on the grounds that it is the only model for which we have a clear model and with which we have some prior familiarity, not to mention that the representational model more easily allows for physicalistic reduction. So the upshot of this first stage of investigation is the view that a state has subjective character by virtue of being represented to be a state of the subject.

Now this much had already been argued by “higher-order” theorists, most notably David Rosenthal (1997). Rosenthal emphasizes that conscious states are those we are conscious of, which turn out to be those represented by suitably related higher-order thoughts. Where Kriegel differs from Rosenthal is that Kriegel claims that the higher-order state and the first-order state are in fact one and the same; hence the self-representation referred to in the name of the theory. Kriegel offers several arguments for preferring the single-state self-representation theory to the standard two-state higher-order theory, a matter to which I’ll return.

When it comes to qualitative character, Kriegel holds a narrow representational view. According to a representational view, qualitative character is identified with the representational content of a perceptual or sensory representation. So, for example, the reddish qualitative character of a visual experience of a ripe tomato is the property of representing the tomato to be red. At this point, representational theories divide over how to understand the relevant representational content. Externalist representationalists take the relevant content to be something like a spectral reflectance, a mind-independent and response-independent property of the object (Dretske 1995 and Tye 1995). Kriegel opts for a different view. He identifies qualitative character with the representation of a certain response-dependent property of the object: that disposition of the object to cause certain neural states in organisms of the relevant type under normal conditions. As he notes, his view is internalist, in the sense that qualitative character supervenes on the physical structure of the perceiver, whereas for externalists it supervenes on the way the world is outside the head as well.

This is how Kriegel describes his view in chapter 3, but, as he warns the reader there, there is actually a crucial amendment to the view that appears in chapter 4. It turns out that the first-order content of the representational state does not determine the state’s qualitative character after all. Rather, to find out what the qualitative character is, we have to look at the higher-order content of the state — the self-representational component of the state’s content.

To see how this works, consider again the visual experience of the ripe tomato. This conscious state has a first-order content that attributes a particular response-dependent property (among others) — call it R — to the tomato. At the second-order level, the state represents itself as having a certain content — say, as attributing R to the tomato. The first-order content he calls the “schmalitative character” of the conscious state, and the content attributed to the state by the second-order content is the qualitative character strictly speaking. Of course in standard cases these contents will coincide, so the schmalitative and qualitative characters will be the same. But sometimes they may come apart. One’s visual system may be representing the tomato as instantiating R, but one may be representing oneself to be representing the tomato as instantiating G. In such a case the qualitative character of the experience is G, not R.

Getting back to subjective character, an important part of the story for Kriegel involves a distinction between “peripheral” and “focal” inner awareness. As applied to normal, outer-directed perceptual attention the distinction is familiar. As I type this review on my computer, I see the words on the screen, but also the envelopes on my desk, the keyboard, and a number of other objects in my field of vision. I am visually attending to the words on the screen — and not to all of them, of course, but the ones appearing as I type — they occupy my focal attention. But I am also aware of the other objects; certainly in a way that I am not visually aware of the door behind my back. We can describe these other objects of which I’m visually aware as occupying the periphery of my visual attention.

The application to inner awareness is meant to capture the difference between standard cases of conscious perceptual experience, on the one hand, and full-blown introspective attention to experience, on the other. As I’m looking at the computer screen while typing I am consciously aware of the words as they appear on the screen, and it’s clear that my attention is directed toward the screen, not myself or my experience. Yet, if this is to count as a conscious experience, there must be some sense in which it is “for me”, and, for Kriegel, this means it’s being represented by me. Kriegel captures the difference between the two objects of awareness – the screen and the experience of the screen – by appeal to the difference between peripheral and focal attention. I am focally aware of the screen, but only peripherally aware of my experience. Once we have this distinction in play, we can then say that what happens when I indulge in full-blown introspection is that an attention shift takes place. Whereas before I was focally aware of the screen and peripherally aware of the experience, now I am focally aware of the experience.

At the end of chapter 4, Kriegel provides a full-dress articulation of his account of subjective character, which goes like this:

(SR) Necessarily, for any mental state M, M has subjective character iff M is non-derivatively, specifically, and essentially self-representing.

Non-derivative representation is the sort that minds do, as opposed to the representation of the words on my screen. Specific self-representation involves picking out the state in question through a singular representation, as opposed to some general description it happens to fall under, such as “all the mental states I’m now occupying”. Finally, essential self-representation is the sort one has with first-person indexicals like “I” and “me”, as opposed to definite descriptions that happen to pick one out. So “the mental state representing the computer screen” doesn’t count, while “this very mental state” does.

So does this theory work? Does it give a convincing account of phenomenal consciousness? I don’t think so. In fact, I find the position riddled with holes. I will confine my critical remarks to three important issues: the argument for abandoning the two-state higher-order theory for the self-representational theory, the account of qualitative character, and the ontological structure of conscious states on the self-representational view.

1. Kriegel’s principal argument that we need self-representation, as opposed to standard two-state higher-order representation, goes like this. On a two-state view, only the lower-order state is conscious, not the higher-order one (unless, as is usually not the case, it is targeted by yet a higher-order state itself). But clearly subjective character, the conscious state’s being “for me”, is itself “phenomenologically manifest”, and thus must be conscious. If we grant this requirement, we are off on an infinite regress, unless we stop the regress in its tracks by the one-state self-representational move.

Why must we say that the higher-order state is conscious as well? Kriegel realizes that appealing to the intuition that it is phenomenologically manifest will not convince his opponents, so he trots out an interesting argument, which goes like this. If subjective character were not something itself of which we were conscious — which, on the standard two-state view, it isn’t — then how would we know about it in the first place? That is, on what basis would we argue that all conscious states have subjective character? He discusses various options and dismisses them, leaving only the claim that it is because subjective character is phenomenologically part of every conscious experience do we know that it is an essential component of phenomenally conscious states.

One option Kriegel dismisses is that we know about subjective character through introspection. He has two objections to this view. First, since the vast majority of our conscious states are not explicitly introspected, the fact that we find subjective character in the ones we do introspect provides an insufficient inductive basis to project to the rest. But if every time we introspect we discover this feature of our conscious experience, under all circumstances, why wouldn’t this be sufficient evidence? Why think the un-introspected ones are any different? This is where the second objection comes into play. Since when we introspect we are obviously making ourselves aware of our conscious state, there is reason to think that the sample is biased. Yes, we find subjective character when introspecting, but that’s just what the introspecting itself is introducing, and therefore we shouldn’t consider these cases as representative of all conscious states.

But this objection confuses two distinct levels of higher-order representation. On the standard higher-order theory, introspection involves three levels of representation: the ground-level perceptual state, representing whatever it does about the external world; the second-order state, representing the ground-level one, and thus making it conscious; and a third-order state, representing the second-order one (or maybe both second-order and ground-level), constituting the introspective state. True, the third-level state only appears when introspecting, but of course it isn’t the state of which we are conscious in these circumstances (unless we go ahead and introspect the introspecting, thus introducing a fourth-order state). What we are conscious of when introspecting is the second-order state, and there is no reason to think that the introduction of the extra level of awareness through introspecting is responsible for introducing this second-order state that is found there. Thus there is no reason to think the introspected sample is biased. Hence, no real argument against the two-state view.1

2. Remember, for Kriegel qualitative character is the representation of a response-dependent property of the object. (For present purposes I’m ignoring the qualitative/schmalitative distinction.) Any such account has to find a way to independently characterize the relevant response, on pain of circularity. As mentioned above, Kriegel’s move is to go neural. But then he notices a problem: namely, if we specify the relevant response neurally, then we lose multiple realizability. It will turn out that no two creatures who are physiologically different can ever have an experience with the same qualitative character. Kriegel’s response is to claim that we can characterize the relevant response as a “conjunctive disposition”. It’s the property of eliciting R1 in creatures of kind K1 in circumstances C1, and R2 in creatures of kind K2, in circumstances C2, etc.

So, let’s work out a case. Norma is looking at the sky and having an experience with bluish quality, Stella is looking at the sky and having an experience of the same quality, and Norman is looking at the sky and having an experience of yellowish quality. We want to say that all three experiences are (or at least can be) veridical. That means the sky must have both properties, what Norma and Stella represent it to have and what Norman represents it to have. These can’t be the same property, for then it would follow that Norma and Norman are experiencing the same qualia, and, by hypothesis, they aren’t. So they have to be two distinct properties instantiated by the sky at the time in question.

According to Kriegel, these are response-dependent properties. The issue then is to specify the response without appealing to qualitative character itself, on pain of undermining the reductive character of the account. As just mentioned, Kriegel proposes to use physical properties as the relevant responses, and then to deal with multiple realization of qualitative character by appeal to “conjunctive dispositions”. So what makes Norma’s and Stella’s experiences both count as of bluish quality, given that Norma’s involves physical state N1 and Stella’s involves N2? Well, it’s that they represent the same property B. What is B? It’s the conjunctive disposition to cause N1 in Norma (and her relevant peers) and N2 in Stella (and her relevant peers).

Okay, so now we have Norma, Norman, and Stella all looking at the sky together. Each is responding with a different physical state, N1 for Norma, N2 for Stella, and N3 for Norman. However, Norma and Stella are experiencing the same quality by virtue of their representing B, which is defined in terms of causing N1 in Norma and N2 in Stella, but Norman’s response is not among the dispositional conjuncts of B, so he isn’t sharing their qualitative experience. But of course there’s property C, which does include all three conjuncts. So what makes it the case that it’s B they are representing and not C?

Perhaps Kriegel will say that you start out with an intuitive grasp of Norma and Stella sharing a quality and Norman not, and then fashion your specification of the response to fit this. But this seems unworkable for two reasons. First, on what theory of representation — particularly some sort of nomic or teleological theory of the sort Kriegel likes — are you going to get it to come out that it’s precisely B and not C (or any other of the infinitely many conjunctive dispositions one can specify) that Norma and Stella are representing? Second, it clearly relies on an independent fix on qualitative character, one that is totally ungrounded on this account. Of course if you give up multiple realizability, so there’s one response for each possible physical state caused by seeing an object, then this particular problem goes away, but then you get others.

3. Perhaps the most serious question Kriegel addresses is how to understand the self-representation relation itself. That is, what makes it the case that a state represents itself? If Kriegel were not interested in a reductive theory of consciousness he could avoid the problem and just take the representation relation as primitive, and thus self-representation as primitive as well. But Kriegel wants a naturalistic theory, so he must rely on a naturalistic account of representation.

Unfortunately, the only candidates we know of are causal/nomic accounts on the one hand, and functional accounts on the other. The former don’t help much with self-representation, since states don’t cause themselves. (The problem is basically that either everything represents itself on such a view or nothing does.) Functional role accounts might work, but then we lose something else that is crucial to Kriegel: the categorical, or manifest nature of self-awareness. After all, straight representationalist theories of phenomenal consciousness — without any explicit higher-order representation — handle subjective character in terms of a disposition to be available to various high-level processes, such as report and action planning.2 Kriegel’s main reason for insisting on explicit higher-order representation is that without it the self-awareness of subjective character loses its status as a categorical state, and thus ceases to be the sort of thing that can be phenomenologically manifest. But if we adopt a functional account of self-representation, then we lose this advantage over the straight representationalist position, and we might as well abandon any appeal to higher-order representation, whether of the two-state or the one-state variety.

Note that the two-state view doesn’t have this problem. The two-state view can help itself to whatever causal or nomic theory of representation eventually wins out, since there is no obvious reason one mental state couldn’t stand in this relation to another. So what Kriegel does to solve his problem is to compromise a bit with the two-state view. That is, rather than what I will call a “one-vehicle-one-state” view, Kriegel holds a “two-vehicle-one-state” view. On the former, though the physical state realizing the self-representational mental state has physical parts, it does not break down into representational components with one representing the other. On the latter model, however, there are separable parts of the state, such that one part represents the distal situation and the second represents the first part. Since there is a physical distinction between the two parts of the one state, it is possible to employ some sort of causal account of representation to ground the second part’s representing the first part.

Of course now the problem is to distinguish this two-vehicle-one-state view from the standard two-state view. After all, calling two states “one state” doesn’t make them so, and since the representational contents of these two parts of the one state are distinct, there seems to be every reason to consider them two states. Kriegel responds in two ways. First, he claims that there is a difference between a view that treats two states as parts of one state merely by “summing” them, and one that treats them as parts of one state by virtue of their standing in a relation that genuinely integrates them into a “complex” state. The integration he has in mind involves the kind of “binding” of two representations that we see in normal perception. In perception the visual system must integrate a representation that something is red with a representation that something is square — representations realized in different visual sub-systems — to get a representation of something that is a red square, and one hypothesis for how this is done has to do with synchronous firing in the two sub-systems. Kriegel proposes that just this sort of integration occurs between the first-order and the second-order representations involved in a conscious perceptual experience (hence he calls this “cross order integration”), and he speculates that synchronous firing could be the mechanism that implements the integration in this case as well.

The second element in the response is to introduce the idea of “indirect representation”. The point is that we want the entire state to be what’s represented, not just one part by another, for otherwise we wouldn’t have any advantage over the standard two-state view, since the subjective character would not itself be phenomenologically manifest, since not self-represented. But we can only get a causal account going if we have one part representing the other, and therefore not representing itself. The way out is to claim that the causal account gives us the “direct” representation of the first-order part by the second-order part, and the entire state counts as self-represented by virtue of the second-order part’s “indirectly” representing the entire, complex state. A case that exemplifies the distinction is the way a picture can represent a house, indirectly, by directly representing (picturing) the front of the house. Similarly, the visual system always has only partial access to what’s being viewed, yet, by directly representing what’s in the field of vision, it indirectly represents an entire object, including parts that are occluded from vision. Basing his account on this sort of analogy, Kriegel claims that the second-order part of the conscious state indirectly represents the entire state by directly representing the first-order part.

It seems to me that neither the appeal to cross-order integration nor to indirect representation works.[3] Consider again the way that representations of color and shape are bound together. It’s supposed to work something like this. We start with two distinct representations of the form “x is red” and “y is square”, where the singular terms are keyed to features maps. Through some implementing mechanism (maybe synchronous firing) the two representations become one and we get “z is red and square”. The point is that the latter representation, with “z” representing the object, is distinct (functionally, that is) from either of the other two. Now, what sort of merging of first-order and second-order contents on Kriegel’s view is supposed to work like that? We are given no idea how the relevant contents are supposed to be merged.4 What’s more, if they were integrated in anything like the way that standard binding works, we’d have a one-vehicle model after all.

Let me elaborate on this last point. When individuating mental states, there are (at least) two levels of aggregation to consider: the physical implementation level and the psychological level (the level of the virtual machine). What are counted as individual psychological states may be implemented by extremely complex physical states, containing physical state parts that are integrated in various ways. The part-whole structure of the physical implementation, however, does not automatically transfer to the psychological state(s) implemented. It depends on whether these physical parts receive a psychological interpretation.

Now, on Kriegel’s story we start with two states, S1 and S2, where S1 is a representation of a ripe tomato, and S2 represents that S1 is occurring. Now suppose that they are integrated via something like synchronous firing. The physical integration is irrelevant to the question of whether or not we have one state unless there is a genuine merger of the contents of the two states. But what sort of merger are we talking about? If it’s still the case that S1 represents the ripe tomato and S2 represents S1, in what sense do we have a single psychological state? If, however, the S1 and S2 contents genuinely merge — so that either, as in the binding case, a representational element from both parts functions as a single symbol5, or somehow the two parts function to spread the two representational contents over the entire combined state — then it’s unclear why the psychological state is considered to have two distinct parts. Again, the two-part structure at the physical implementation level is irrelevant. Kriegel’s attempt to have it both ways — two states in one — exchanges the mystery of consciousness for the mystery of the Trinity.

But suppose this could work. (After all, many people do believe in the Trinity.) There is still the question of what precisely is being represented at the higher-order level. Does S2 represent just S1, or the combined S1-S2 state? As mentioned above, Kriegel needs it to be the latter, for if it isn’t, then the advantage over the two-state version is lost. The principal advantage of the one-state view over the two-state view is supposed to be that it makes subjective character itself phenomenologically manifest. Being phenomenologically manifest, on Kriegel’s theory, is to be represented. So the representing of S1, done by S2, must itself be somehow represented. This is where the appeal to indirect representation is supposed to do the job.

But how does this work? Again, we are given examples that are importantly unlike the situation at hand. Pictures and perceptual experiences represent entire objects by picturing (or seeing) their parts. But is that what happens? True, I say I see the house when I see its front, but does that mean my visual system is literally representing the whole house by virtue of representing the front of it? And is the whole house phenomenologically manifest to me? It seems to me that one might say I represent the entire house in thought based on the visual presentation of the front, thus yielding two representations, not one with both direct and indirect contents. The problem is that we just have no clear model of indirect representation that would help us determine if its application in this case yields a position that meets the necessary desiderata.

On page 230 Kriegel worries about this problem, but treats it as relatively unimportant. To my mind this issue strikes at the heart of his theory. Again, if the higher-order (part of the) state is not represented, then we aren’t aware of it, and then we have no fundamental difference between this view and standard higher-order theory. It’s not enough that somehow the entire state is indirectly represented if that doesn’t amount to an awareness of the subjective character itself. In fact, at an earlier point in his argument a similar problem arose, and there too it seemed to me that Kriegel brushed it off too quickly with an expedient that doesn’t really speak to the problem.

When initially laying out his argument against the two-state view, Kriegel set it up as a dilemma: either the higher-order state is itself unconscious (bad, for reasons discussed above) or it’s conscious, but then we invite a regress of increasingly higher-order states. At that point he considers an objection that his view is subject to a regress of sorts as well. After all, even if there’s one state, aren’t there two contents, the first-order one and the second-order one? But can’t we ask whether a content, as well as a state, is conscious? If so, then the same dilemma ought to work against Kriegel’s own view. His response is to say that for a content to be conscious is just for it to be the (or a) content of a conscious state. So the higher-order content needn’t be itself represented by another content to be conscious, since it is already a content of a conscious state; that is, of a state that is the explicit target of the higher-order content itself.

But while this move allows Kriegel to call the higher-order content “conscious”, and I can’t object to a stipulation here, it doesn’t seem to do the work we need done, which is to get subjective character into our awareness. If we’re going to understand awareness as representation, then the content of awareness has to be identified with representational content. I don’t see how we can allow something to count as what we’re aware of by, as it were, proxy — which is what this move and the indirect representation move seem to have in common.

Finally, now that we have Kriegel’s two-vehicle-one-state model presented, we can return to the other argument I mentioned in note 1 against the two-state view. The problem is that on the two-state model it ought to be possible for the higher-order state to occur even though there is no lower-order state it is actually representing. We can think of this as a kind of internal hallucination. I represent myself as having an experience I’m not actually having. The problem is that it seems to undermine the relational character of the higher-order view. If, as we assume would be the case on this view, what it’s like for one suffering such an internal hallucination is just the same as what it’s like for someone really having the represented experience, then it seems that the internal hallucinator is really having the experience as well. But this then makes the lower-order state superfluous.

Whether or not one finds this problematic, Kriegel thinks it is, and therefore he argues that his self-representational account is better since it isn’t subject to this objection. Since the state is representing itself, the higher-order representation cannot occur without the lower-order state it is representing, namely, itself. But once we adopt the two-vehicle version of the one-state view, the objection reappears. Why couldn’t S2 occur without S1? Now Kriegel will say that since S1 isn’t there, and so there is no state with which S2 can integrate, there is no basis for the indirect representational content; therefore the relevant higher-order representational content does not appear without the state it’s representing — that is, the integrated state consisting of S1 and S2. While that’s certainly right, we still want to know, according to Kriegel, what it’s like for the subject. Is there any reason to think he can avoid the same dilemma that faces the two-state view? I don’t see why. Remember, given his view that qualitative character, the “what” of what it’s like, is identified by the representational content of the higher-order state, not the lower-order one, is there any basis in his theory for thinking that in an S2-without-S1 situation it would be any different for the subject than it is when we have the full-fledged S2-with-S1 situation?

What then to make of these various problems with the view? Is there a lesson here? To me, the lesson is that consciousness really is like the Trinity in the end. Somehow conscious awareness has a differentiable act-object structure but of a sort that involves genuine, not superficial, unity. This is why I have come to believe that the awareness relation involved in conscious experience cannot be explicated in terms of representational states, at least not reductively, as one must either sacrifice the phenomenology or sacrifice the representation relation. Kriegel has done us the service of showing us the limits of the representational approach through his long and arduous attempt to make it all work.


Chalmers, D. (1996). The Conscious Mind. Oxford: Oxford UP.

Dretske, F. (1995). Naturalizing the Mind. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books/The MIT Press.

Levine, J. (1983). “Materialism and Qualia: The Explanatory Gap”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 64, 354-361.

Levine, J. (2001). Purple Haze: The Puzzle of Consciousness. New York: Oxford UP.

Rosenthal, D. (1997). “A Theory of Consciousness”, in Block, N., Flanagan, O., and Güzeldere, G. eds., The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates, Cambridge: MIT Press, 729-753.

Tye, M. (1995). Ten Problems of Consciousness: A Representational Theory of the Phenomenal Mind. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books/M.I.T. Press.

1 There is actually another argument Kriegel employs to establish the superiority of the self-representation theory over the two-state theory, which is its ability to avoid the possibility plaguing the two-state view of there being a kind of internal hallucination, with the higher-order state occurring without an appropriate lower-order target. I will return to this question after developing my criticism of his position on the ontological structure of conscious states below.

2 As in Tye’s (1995) so-called PANIC account, where the “P” stands for “poised”.

3 In both cases I’m tempted to use the dachshund joke to exemplify the problem. (Don’t know it? Ask Louise Antony, it’s her favorite joke.)

4 This is the relevance of the aforementioned joke: it’s just like the standard binding case, just different.

5 In the binding case the two singular terms come to function as one.