Subjectivity: Ancient and Modern

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R.J. Snell and Steven F. McGuire (eds.), Subjectivity: Ancient and Modern, Lexington Books, 2016, 248pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498513180.

Reviewed by Mark K. Spencer, University of St. Thomas (MN)


This anthology presents the proceedings of a conference on subjectivity conducted at the Agora Institute for Civic Virtue and the Common Good in Philadelphia in 2014. Included are eight essays, with a substantive response essay to each. The essays consider some debates about the modern "turn to the subject" considered in relation to pre-modern treatments of the same subject. By 'turn to the subject' I mean the emphasis in certain strands of philosophy of the last few centuries on the interior, first-person, or subjective perspective, as opposed to an exterior or third-person perspective. However, the anthology is not an introduction to these debates, but presupposes familiarity with them. While there is a short introductory essay that identifies a few overlapping themes in the papers, it takes a bit of digging to identify most of the issues that tie the anthology together. In this review, I will draw out some of those issues, so as to present this disparate collection in a unified way.

For those who already have an interest in these debates, the anthology makes some significant contributions. A primary strength of the book is that, reading essays side-by-side on thinkers that you would prima facie rarely associate with one another, you come to see overlapping themes regarding subjectivity across philosophical schools. For example, it turns out that the phenomenologist Levinas and the proponents of New Natural Law theory have quite similar views regarding the infallibility of knowing what we intend or desire. While the book comes to no settled conclusions, the contributions correct each other through the structure of essay and reply, and the reader is able to see many of the ramifications of each debate.

No single volume could hope to do justice to the entire theme of subjectivity; this book approaches the issue from a broadly "classical" angle. All the writers included think that ancient and medieval authors -- such as Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus, and Aquinas -- have something crucial to say to contemporary debates about subjectivity, especially when approached through the lens of contemporary recoverers of that tradition, such as Strauss and Voegelin. The book also has a broadly "anti-Cartesian" approach. The so-called Cartesian approach (which, on the view of many of the authors, is tantamount to subjectivism or even nihilism) holds that I am only fully certain of my own existence as a subject (that is, a being with a first-person perspective), while all objective realities are subject to my control and to the meaning that I place upon them. This is surely not in fact Descartes' view, but the authors of these essays are not interested so much in a critique of Descartes as in developing approaches to subjectivity that show the subject's openness to a world not of its own devising, where meaning and value are given to, but not created by, the subject. But they hold that showing this, and discovering a plausible metaphysics and ethics, requires thinking about these things from the first-person perspective. The essays' themes are also broadly "Catholic", positively engaging with classical authors important to the Catholic philosophical tradition, and with some more recent member of that tradition, such as Maritain, Anscombe, and the New Natural Lawyers (especially Germain Grisez and John Finnis).

The first essay, by McGuire, takes up Voegelin's claim that Aristotle gives two accounts of human nature. First, there is the hylomorphic analysis which Voegelin thinks subordinates the person to third-person categories. Second, there is the position that human persons are open through intentionality to the transcendent (a view Voegelin holds is incompatible with the first) . This introduces what I take to be the central question of this anthology: how can we best work out an account of the human person, from the point of view of first-person experience, on which we are open to the transcendent? This question is applied, for example, to work by Foucault and Derrida in Lee Trepanier's reply to McGuire. But a central problem with this book is also introduced in this essay: in an attempt to describe the open-ended human orientation to transcendence, there is a mistrust of being able to make concrete, categorical, objective claims about what we naturally are. An antagonism between the personal or subjective on the one hand, and the natural or conceptual on the other, permeates most of the essays. Definite claims about human nature, such as Aristotle makes in his hylomorphism, are taken to be detrimental to an account of the person as open to the transcendent. One result is a lack of serious engagement with other approaches to subjectivity that in many respects are also interested in a "classical" approach, such as traditional or analytic Thomism.

A second important question is introduced by Elizabeth A. Murray's treatment of Lonergan on subjectivity: what is the relation between what we call "subjects" or the "subjective" and what we call "objects" and the "objective"? The modern turn to the subject threatens to immure us in an immanent or subjectivistic point of view, unable to know objective truth or get to a world "out there". Lonergan's solution is to take up an analysis of the subject as one is really presented to oneself. He argues that intellectual judgment, normatively regulated by the pure desire to know, can get us to genuine objective truth. Only properly understood subjectivity guarantees objectivity. In reply, Matthew B. O'Brien shows that followers of Wittgenstein, especially Anscombe, achieve similar success in getting us out of an immanent point of view.

The importance of the first-person perspective for ethics is taken up in the next two essays, both of them defenses of New Natural Law Theory (hereafter NNL), by Sherif Girgis and Christopher O. Tollefsen. A central claim of NNL is that the content of the natural law is discovered not by a third-person examination of the ends to which human nature is oriented, but by considering the ends to which we are oriented in our first-person practical reasoning -- that is, those ultimate goods that we seek to instantiate in every action. Girgis argues that practical rationality is open to incommensurable goods, and so, in line with the general trends of the claims in this anthology, open to ever-greater fulfillment. Tollefsen contends that NNL, unlike any other ethical theory, brings together first-person and third-person perspectives in a coherent, mutually reinforcing way.

Regardless of what one thinks about the acrimonious debates over NNL, these essays provide what I think are the clearest and most succinct summaries of the theory that I have ever read. The critiques of the theory in the replies, by Mark Shiffman and Amy Gilbert Richards, are unique -- not the standard critiques from the point of view of traditional natural law theory. And they are valuable contributions to that debate. Shiffman, with biting polemic, argues that the classical ethical tradition focused not on production of goods through action, but on the "ordering of our loves" (90) and the "thumotic desire for self-betterment" (91). These are aspects of our first-person ethical lives that are lost in the propositionally-focused, quasi-NNL. This individualism is also a focus of Richards' critique. On NNL, when I reason about what I should do, I seek to instantiate certain basic goods, such as health or friendship or aesthetic enjoyment; I then propose propositionally-described courses of action to myself, which guide my action. But this, Richards contends, is not what we normally do when we act. Rather, we act not primarily as first persons, but as second persons, that is as "called into being through the address of others and constituted by our relations to them" (120). We act not on the basis of propositional proposals for action, but on the basis of "gestalts", whole scenes, laden with value. These guide our attention to what is to be done -- that is, to what is most beautiful or to what best responds to other persons as such.

Richards points to a theme which is taken up in a variety of ways in the remaining essays: subjectivity is more than just a first-personal perspective on the world, and is always already conditioned by something prior to that perspective, and prior to the opposition of subject and object. The earlier essays try to show how we can get out to the world from a subjective starting point; later essays try to show that the subjective starting-point is not purely first-personal. Through a wide-ranging reading of de Tocqueville, Strauss, Michael Davis, and Levinas, Ralph Hancock argues (as does Richard Velkley in his reply) that complete self-knowledge is impossible. Rather, the self-knowledge and self-possession that is possible for us requires an awareness of the greater wholes to which we always first belong, mediated by poetry, philosophy, politics, and perhaps also revealed religion. Any attempt to achieve complete self-knowledge actually "subjects" us to some impersonal power like Hegelian history. Attempts to ground the subject outside of these wholes, as Levinas does (and, in a similar way, as the NNL theory tries to do) are doomed to alienate us from the world that is the only source of meaning that we can achieve.

In a similar vein, David Walsh takes up a question that lurks behind many of the essays. The thinkers invoked (such as Voegelin and Strauss) sought, Walsh claims, to recover the basic experiences that first gave rise to philosophy, vital experiences of participating in the good, the true, and the beautiful. But they often failed to argue for their claims. However, in this failure, they inadvertently discovered, Walsh says, that the person is prior to anything that can be explained or conceptualized -- prior to all of being, as Walsh puts it. The person is the movement toward transcendence, and is the condition for the possibility of everything else, including all argument. For this reason, arguments cannot be given regarding the person as such. Phillip Cary, in his refreshing reply, points out that this is in effect a recovery of the Plotinian notion of the person as nous prior to all things. He (rightly in my opinion) contends that this overly metaphysical approach loses sight, of the fact that we human subjects are embodied, living in dramatic dialogue with one another, and created by God. In a line that overcomes many of the debates in the book, Cary points out that really each of us is a "first person speaking to a second person overheard by a third person" (172). Many of the essays privilege one of these "persons" over the other, or try to find something prior to them all. Cary points out that all such attempts are untrue to the actual situation of our subjectivity.

The two most Catholic contributions come last. V. Bradley Lewis reprises the 1940's debate between Charles de Koninck and Maritain over the common good, tentatively supporting de Koninck's position. He provides a fine overview of the debate in Catholic philosophy and Church teaching over the meaning of 'common good.' De Koninck holds that human persons are subordinate to the common good, while Maritain holds that the common good (or at least the political common good) is brought about for the sake of human persons. Surprisingly, given this book's strong classical and Catholic roots, this is the only essay that engages with the 20th century tradition of Catholic personalism in any detail. Perhaps even more importantly, it is the only essay that engages in any meaningful way with traditional scholasticism -- which really did, contrary to what seems to be presupposed by most of the authors, have a strong account of subjectivity, especially in its accounts of the reflexivity of the intellect and of intentional relations. The essays on NNL use traditional scholasticism as a whipping boy, but there is no real engagement with the subtle ways in which first and third-person perspectives were blended in that tradition. Lewis offers an interesting critique of the dangers into which personalism can fall, but his most important contribution is its recasting of an important political and metaphysical debate over the common good as a debate about the proper place of human subjectivity in its political and cosmic context. Daniel Mark, in his reply, offers a synthesis of the two positions, built around NNL.

Finally, James Greenaway further takes up the question of the place of subjectivity in a larger whole. He defends a Neo-Platonic approach to this question, especially that of Eriugena; on his reading, Neo-Platonism is fundamentally a "philosophy of belonging" (206). We subjects belong to or "fit with" (206) the cosmos; to belong is to exist-from some source and exist-towards some end. Greenaway also assigns William of Ockham a positive place (and one similar to Maritain in Lewis' essay) in this account of subjectivity: Ockham shows that the subject's belonging to the cosmos gives the subject an authority of his or her own, over against ecclesial and political authorities. I found this treatment of Ockham quite refreshing. This anthology in many respects builds on the "narrative of modernity" set up by thinkers like Alasdair MacIntyre, and in that narrative, Ockham is often unfairly disparaged -- but not so here! In his reply, Jeremy D. Wilkins shows how Greenaway's piece departs in significant respects from Christian orthodoxy. But Wilkins also helps develop Greenaway's notion of belonging through some disambiguations of words like 'presence' and 'subject' -- elucidations of terms that would have been helpful much earlier in the book.

This is a rough overview of what is really a rich, if disparate, book. That said, as I mentioned earlier, it is not for those unfamiliar with these debates. Unfortunately, the book is too insular; for all their disagreements, the contributors are too self-assured regarding their shared classical, Catholic presuppositions -- presuppositions that I share, but which, in an anthology like this, should be subjected to much closer scrutiny. It would have been helpful to see more engagement both with non-standard Catholic sources -- especially Descartes, who, as mentioned above, is invoked as an antagonist throughout the volume, but whose actual positions and texts are never engaged. In this, the book suffers from the prejudices that I see in many "narratives of modernity." Likewise, there is no engagement with the hermeneutical tradition of thinkers like Gadamer or Ricœur, nor, more surprisingly, much engagement with the Catholic personalism of Max Scheler, Von Hildebrand, and Stein. These thinkers have played an important role in Christian and classically-oriented engagements with subjectivity. They could easily and profitably have been considered in several essays. But one book can only do so much. This book is a modest but, at least in some essays, important contribution to a central debate of our times.