Subjectivity and Being Somebody: Human Identity and Neuroethics

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Grant Gillett, Subjectivity and Being Somebody: Human Identity and Neuroethics, Imprint Academic, 2008, 286pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 9781845401160.

Reviewed by George Graham, Georgia State University


This book is about our across-time identity or persistence as persons, metaphysically speaking. It offers a theory of personal identity or persistence and outlines some of its ethical applications and implications. But it is primarily about persistence.

A theory of personal identity or persistence describes what it is for one and the same person to exist continuously over a period of time, undergoing qualitative change, perhaps even dramatic change. Gillett considers several sorts of qualitative change in this book. These include changes brought about by psychosurgery and neural implantation as well as various psychiatric illnesses.

Gillett's general approach to personal identity is in the neo-Lockean or psychological continuity tradition. The neo-Lockean is committed to human persons being coincident with, but not identical to, living human animal bodies, biologically individuated. If physicalism is interpreted as necessitating that persons and their bodies, including brains, must possess all of their properties in common, this seems to leave something out that is important about our identities as persons. This something may be called the subjectivity of a particular person, viz. what it is like to be that person and to possess a unique first-person perspective on one's self and the world. Assuming, as a neo-Lockean does, that something is left out by physical analyses of personal identity means we should distinguish subjective constituents of personal identity (viz. properties that concern what it is like to a person to exist) and 'somatic' elements of identity that belong to the biologically individuated animal body.

Gillett conceives of the mix of subjective and physical components in personal identity in a neo-Aristotelian fashion. His idea goes something like this: a human person comes into being or existence when a first-person perspective or pattern or form of subjectivity emerges in or is imposed on a living human animal body. We persons are in some sense partially made up, over the period of our lives, of a living human animal body, but when and only when that animal body possesses a capacity to consciously think of self and world. It is then an embodied person, an embodied human subject.

What is the first-person perspective of an embodied person like? What is its contour or character? Gillett's view is that the perspective is structured as narrative in form and that particular embodied narratives constitute our individual identities as persons. As our embodied narrative persists, so we persist. The embodied person, he says, weaves "together a … narrative in a way that locates him or her … in [the] world" (p. 97).

The notion of the narrative subject is not unique to Gillett, of course, as he readily and generously acknowledges. Numerous philosophers and others have given the notion vivid expression in a variety of different philosophical contexts: Charles Taylor, Marya Schechtman, and Alasdair MacIntyre, to name but three. One common element in such expressions is the idea that the narrative or story-like structure of a first-person perspective means that human subjectivity has a unifying form or overarching contour. It has a coherent developmental pattern, is not disjointed or episodic. Gillett writes: "The active subject [is] the lead player and narrator in the compilation and editing of life experience as a coherent whole" (p. 96).

Gillett puts his own conceptual autograph on the notion of the narrative structure of personal persistence. He acknowledges, for instance, that patterns of personal narration can be disordered, motley or entangled. Although there are "connectional constraints within every narrative", some people, he says, such as victims of neurological and psychiatric disorders, may find themselves "prone to disruption because of their emotional reactivity and problems in mastering … relevant [narrative] skills" (pp. 187-188). Just how to understand and treat a person in such circumstances raises a number of moral dilemmas and requires specific sorts of refinements in how best to understand the purported coherence of subjectivity. One prominent theme in his discussion of such dilemmas as well as in his description of the notion of narrative coherence is that "a vision of things deeper than or transcendent of the everyday or material" is needed to appreciate the many differences and details in the subjectivity of persons (p. 216). (I don't believe I properly understand this theme or its consistency with Gillett's notion of embodied subjectivity. So I do not plan to discuss it, except to note that it quite obviously concerns human spirituality. But I mention its presence in the book and apparent importance to Gillett.)

Gillett also takes what may be described as interactionist and expressivist lines on just what constitutes the embodied narrative of a person. You and I as embodied interact with others in our social worlds and our narratives are molded and shaped by others. The people with whom we engage are parts of our stories and loop into our first-person conceptions of self and world. Another related dimension of embodiment is that it functions as the physical space for first-person perspectives to express themselves publically (p. 245). When we discern an agent's intentional bodily movements, then "we discern, in some small way, the narrative s/he is living" (p. 125). So, one dimension of our embodied subjectivity consists in our being socially affected. Another consists in our being socially expressive.

Pruning Gillett's conceptions down to their bare essentials on any topic is no small chore. Throughout the book he is expansive in the range of his interlocking considerations. The topics he examines are multitudinous. Action. Automatism. Brain bisection. Conceptual development. Consciousness. Dementia. Ding-an-sich. Diseases. Essences. Eugenics. In stopping the list arbitrarily there, I fail not just to exit from the 'E's' but to mention all of the topics from A to E.

With so many and various topics in the book, I need a specific focus for this review. So, I aim to continue to concentrate on Gillett's central notion of embodied narrativity. Readers of this review should be aware, though, that there is much in this book that I neglect.

By embracing a notion of narrative embodiment and interpreting it in special ways, Gillett hopes to show that thinkers or philosophers who ignore it end up with views of personal persistence that are unable to sensibly and sensitively answer some pressing metaphysical and ethical questions about us. Here I mention one of the metaphysical questions that he discusses. It concerns origins.

Suppose that P is a certain person existing in this, the actual world, and in the City of Atlanta. Suppose P originated from a certain sperm and ovum, SO. Suppose that P could not have originated otherwise than from SO. Someone very much like P could have originated otherwise and be living in Atlanta. Because of differences in their origins, however, this particular possible individual could not have been one and the same as P.

Is that supposition correct? Is our origin essential to who we are? Would person P not truly be P, ontically speaking, without originating from SO? If the answer is yes, that's the so-called origin view of our identity as persons. Our origin is essential for ourselves. What does Gillett think of it?

Gillett writes: "The origin view identifies a person as the product of two particular cells [but] misidentifies the person as we know them" (p. 51). How so? Well, the origin view certainly appeals, says Gillett, "to our intuitions" because it "goes along with", as he puts matters, "being-in-the-world with others" and a person's "unique narrative shaping" (p. 48, p. 51). But "a person might have had a different origin and turned out the same", i.e. had one and the same narrative shaping (p. 51). It's the shaping that makes persons, not their origins. So, SO is not essential for P.

Narrative shaping makes us the persons whom we are, not a certain sperm and ovum. Origins are too barren of subjectivity, too shorn of the narrativity of a person. Consider, Gillett says, people who suffer from certain disorders, say, autism or neurotic depression. Ask them if they would rather not have been born than be autistic or neurotically depressed, and you may hear them say things like 'My autism is part of me' or 'If I did not now have my disorder I would be someone else' (p. 56, p. 60). Such responses are readily understandable if we assume that their life-story or narrative is what makes them the people whom they are, not that they originated from this or that sperm and ovum. They are situated in the world as autistic or neurotically depressed.

Readers who are familiar with the literatures on vagueness and identity and on the distinction between numerical and qualitative identity may find Gillett's appeal to narratively structured and embodied subjectivity as the basis of personal identity troubling. For one thing, this criterion is enormously complex. At times in the course of Gillett's discussion it seems conceptually baroque and unwieldy. As he says, in an understatement, it "disrupts our tendency to see the human subject as an object with a fixed nature" (p. 248). Indeed. But a problem, then, is this. Call it the Problem of the Essential Constituents of a Narrative. There is no single, precisely delimited part of a narrative that indisputably deserves to be considered part of the Story of a Person. Not even one's biological origin (SO) is essential to one's tale. So, if you take it that the question of what counts as your continuing to exist over time must have an answer, and if you also believe that your identity is structured by a narrative form of subjectivity, there must be a criterion for qualifying as a proper or essential part of your story. It may not be simple or straightforward to state. But there should be at least some sort of answer to the question of whether this or that event or episode is part of your tale. But there is none.

To illustrate: Suppose that while Quine was writing Word and Object, one of his undergraduate students was under Quine's office window holding a pet rabbit in his hand. Suppose Quine absent-mindedly spotted the student and then suddenly thought to himself, for the first time, "Eureka, translation is indeterminate!". Is that episode something that should appear in Quine's story? The embodied subjectivity of Quine qua Quine? Perhaps yes. But perhaps no. Much depends on the standards that are chosen for proper or essential parts of a story and the relations of nearness to (as Dennett would put it) Quine's center of narrative gravity. The episode is "in" by some standards, but "out" by others. What are the right standards? Gillett does not say. One wonders how he could, since, in a sense, given the complexity of narration and the possible ways of editing and revising a narrative over time, there is a surplus of appealing and unappealing candidates for being part of a story.

So here then is the vagueness worry. Suppose that what makes me the numerical individual that I am is my embodied narrative. But also suppose, as certainly seems to be the case, that there are equally plausible and intractably conflicting ways of including or excluding parts of the story, thus leaving it vague or indeterminate (absent editorial fiat) as to what counts as the embodied me. Presumably, however, personal identity cannot be vague or indeterminate. One reason for saying this is that if personal identity is vague or indeterminate, then it is indeterminate whether I am identical with myself. But surely I am (determinately) identical with myself.

Apparently something has got to give. Either this something is the determinacy of personal identity, the narrative conception of identity, or perhaps the very idea of personal identity.

Someone might say that what prohibits the narrative structure of personal identity from dissolving into indeterminacy is the biological embodiment of a person. Not that the body is free of its own problem of vagueness of individuation. But at least there is no vagueness of the literal dramatic sort that infects a narrative. It must be remembered, however, that Gillett is a neo-Lockean. So the persistence conditions of a person cannot consist for him in the identity conditions of an animal body biologically individuated. As a human somebody, Gillett writes, we are not so "easily located and bounded" (p. 249). It would be a mistake, he says, to identify us, say, with our anatomically delineated bodies. Our body or brain is one thing; we are another.

Gillett's notion of an embodied narrative as a criterion of identity has its problems -- connected with issues of vagueness and identity. But it also has its virtues. One is its moral sensitivity. A prominent general issue in the book is how best to approach a variety of different moral clinical dilemmas in medical and psychiatric practice. (Gillett himself is a neurosurgeon and professor of medical ethics.) His approach to such dilemmas, which include stem cell research, the care of patients with Alzheimer's dementia, and psychosurgery, among others, derives, in good part, from his approach to the metaphysics of personal identity. As he remarks in discussing multiple personality disorder, normative clinical judgments or practices "whereby a person is forced to fit into our normal forensic framework without appreciating his or her fragility and complexity … is the equivalent of grievous … harm" (pp. 192-193). He makes a plea for tolerating different and even sometimes conflicting resolutions of one and the same clinical dilemma.

Part of what worries me about Gillett's view, which is the vagueness and complexity of the notion of narrative, is connected with why I also admire it. It's hard to top the learned and systemic quality of Gillett's treatment of the complex manner in which human lives may be self-conceived. But I am also worried about its scope. Why restrict our first-person perspective to a narrative construction? Suppose life may be lived as a series of discrete episodes independent of any effort at overall construction or interpretation. Suppose that a person may persist in such a manner. Some people claim that they can and do persist in that manner. If that is a fact, if people need not think of themselves in narrative terms, then Gillett's theory of personal persistence is not a theory of persistence as such. It is a theory of one manner in which to conceive of a life.