Subjectivity and Lifeworld in Transcendental Phenomenology

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Sebastian Luft, Subjectivity and Lifeworld in Transcendental Phenomenology, Northwestern University Press, 2011, 450pp., $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810127432.

Reviewed by Ronald Bruzina, University of Kentucky


Any book about the work of Edmund Husserl will be a book about a certain Husserl. One fact about Husserl's work itself that certainly adds to the variety of approaches taken to his thinking is his huge manuscript output from more than forty years of shorthand-written investigations. The fifty-plus volumes of the Husserliana series of Husserl's writings, most of which are extensive selections from this manuscript output -- with some ten volumes being edited editions of works he himself published -- is itself a daunting wealth of material.[1] But it is made more difficult by the diverse character of so much of this manuscript material -- often inchoate, regularly on different stages or levels of inquiry, sometimes clear advances, sometime tentative efforts that get left aside, etc. They are the raw materials of actual investigations underway where, Husserl often remarked in his correspondence, his real work lay.

Luft knows this situation well, and his Introduction speaks of it. Indeed, he worked with these materials himself, editing one of the recent Husserliana volumes.[2]He is well aware, therefore, that his treatment is that of "a certain Husserl", that his interpretation of Husserl's life's work diverges from other treatments. Yet he hopes the case he makes will be treated seriously; it is very seriously meant and is indeed masterful in the organized assembly of points and texts to support his aim in the study.

As an interpretive synthesis of the books Husserl himself published and a judicious selection from the mountain of his manuscript studies, it is an example of what every scholar of Husserl's thinking is required to do.  It tries to determine the interpretive framework that, drawn from the overarching principles -- both positive conceptions and critical methodological points -- actually commands the way Husserl's actual phenomenological investigations proceed in coherence and import up to Husserl's final retrospective on his life's work. In addition, any such interpretive framework has to take into account what those who came after Husserl developed in their own investigations as having some continuity in the same program of phenomenological inquiry. In other words, the framework has to be one that accurately defines phenomenology as a coherent undertaking, yet has sufficient flexibility to allow it to adapt to new insights without distorting or abandoning the defining principles of this program. This also is something Luft well understands, and commits himself to achieving.

Luft neatly summarizes his undertaking in his Introduction, recognizing all this and laying out his ambitious proposal. He is right on target to make the signal feature of Husserl's whole program what Luft terms "The One Structure" -- "in Husserl's terminology, nothing other than the correlational a priori, the essential relation between constituting subject and constituted world" (p. 12, Luft's italics). However, he soon announces what he takes to be "the final shape and ultimate shape of Husserl's phenomenology," namely, "a descriptive-hermeneutic-interpretive analysis of the correlation a priori between subjectivity and lifeworld," with both these construed genetically and intersubjectively." Put another way, this means that subjectivity and lifeworld taken together "constitute[3] culture and the human being in the lifeworld as a cultural being" (p. 27, Luft's italics).

The plan of Luft's book displays how he carries this out. Part 1, "Husserl: The Outlines of the Transcendental-Phenomenological System," has six chapters: Chapter 1 is on "the natural attitude"; Chapter 2 is on the "phenomenological reduction," and some "methodological problems" are taken up in Chapter 3; Chapter 4 is on the "lifeworld," with Chapter 5 on "facticity and historicity" in the lifeworld; Part 1 ends with Chapter 6, a crucial "systematic of the phenomenological system," specifically what Luft terms "the dialectics of the absolute."

Part 2, "Husserl, Kant, and Neo-Kantianism: From Subjectivity to Lifeworld as a World of Culture," examines the philosophic context most germane to Husserl's phenomenology, in a most interesting set of treatments: Chapter 7 on the transcendental idealisms of Husserl and Paul Natorp; Chapter 8 on the method for treating transcendental subjectivity (principally "reconstruction" and "construction") in Natorp and Husserl; Chapter 9 on pursuing "hermeneutic" phenomenology within the conjunction of Husserl, Natorp, and Ernst Cassirer; and Chapter 10 a critical appraisal of Cassirer's "philosophy of symbolic forms."

Part 3, " Toward a Husserlian Hermenutics," has Luft in Chapter 11 integrating his findings regarding Husserl in interaction with NeoKantianism, but now melding Luft's understanding of Husserl on subjectivity with certain features of Hans-Georg Gadamer's theory of hermeneutics -- principally the latter's "effective history [Wirkungsgeschichte]," but also certain overlooked Husserlian elements in Gadamer's work. Chapter 12 is then a final summation on Husserl's "hermeneutical phenomenology as a philosophy of culture," the consummative form of his phenomenological trajectory.

The key elements to making Luft's proposal plausible, and persuasive, lie in how he treats the core operation of "constitution" as the defining "doing" on the part of "transcendental subjectivity" in its intrinsic inseparability from its constitutum, "the world," especially inasmuch as this constitutum -- disclosed via epochÄ“-prepared and reduction-guided reflection -- is the world of human being's ever-operative, living experiential engagement, i.e., the lifeworld. I the human -- reflecting on this One Structure as the fundamental determinant of my own being (and, intersubjectively, our own being) in the genuine "phenomenological attitude" -- have toactually recognize the subject-relatedness of any object experienced in the world precisely as transcendentally effectuated in the world-bound experiencing life that is mine at every concretely actual moment. Indeed, this effectuation is the very "operation" that makes that experience of mine the actual grasp of a real object in the real world.

In this way, Husserl's phenomenology is able a) to define its distinction from NeoKantianism (its close cousin, as Luft explains in detail),[4] and b) to display theconcreteness of findings that is Gadamer's strength in his hermeneutical philosophy, as Luft interprets Gadamer. The only point to add here to represent Luft's synthesizing vision is that "the actual grasp of a real object in the real world" (as I just put it) must be fleshed out to be more than just finding a bare objective object.  In everyday living it will always be an object not only rich in perceptual differentiations in this experience, but also rich in cultural meaning. Needless to say, also, our daily life is far more than just dealing with objects -- there are the people and our interchange with them. Our world is not just a bare natural world, but a multi-dimensional cultural world and a home world.

Luft elaborates this comprehensive conception in remarkable detail through the three parts of his book, artfully supporting his interpretation with quoted material, often from the recently published editions of Husserl's manuscript studies -- not to mention his comparing or contrasting the ideas of Husserl with those of Natorp or Cassirer or Gadamer through both interpretive analyses and deft quotations from each of these thinkers. However, despite the elaborate layout, there remains ambiguity in two core features of this effort that I do not find quite adequately addressed.

The first ambiguity lies in the shift from a person's natural, world-bound reflection to a  genuinely transcendental reflection. This shift to the transcendental, Luft emphasizes, does not take us out of the world, but enables us to "decenter" ourselves from naively taking the world for granted as simply there, and to take instead a view upon the world precisely as constituted by subjectivity. Yet it is a simple change of attitude from the naively "natural attitude" to the enlightened "transcendental attitude" (see pp. 13-16, 18-21, and 93-101). To put it another way, the world does not change in how we actually see it, in how we actually find it in perceptual experience,[5] but in how we think about the world -- or, more accurately: it is a change from not thinking about it at all to actually thinking about it in terms of our transcendental relationship to it in experience, in the critical way phenomenology proposes.

Yet reflection on the transcendental cannot mean that we just form the concept of transcendental world-constituting "subjectivity," that we just turn to thinking about it. We are supposed to find that constitution and the "agency" that "effectuates" it in our own experiential situation as we now "look" at it; after all, we are to be doing phenomenology here, not speculation. But Luft argues that as Husserl advanced (and under probing engagement with Natorp), actually finding ultimate subjectivity in its constitutive genetic depths was not possible! The only way to characterize ultimate constituting subjectivity is through a method termed reconstruction (see pp. 240-253). This would avoid the danger of thinking that the working of my own subjectivity, in experiencing things in the world, was as such the concretely actual working of transcendental "doing" (see pp. 90-100 and 114-116; also pp. 20-21). The change to transcendental phenomenologizing would be to shift to having a genuine transcendental "operation" in reflective view.

The problem with this, however, is that the reconstruction had to be based upon the furthest depth to which phenomenological descriptive analysis could reach inactually finding structures within myself -- in this case the dynamic of temporalizing genetic process, Urzeitigung -- by reflecting upon my own experiencing -- in this case, upon the temporality of my living process of experience.[6] So while Luft argues this gets us to the true transcendental agency of constitutive genesis, he also argues that it amounts to Husserl's no longer working in terms of intuitionally finding the genuinely transcendental, but by a transcendental reconstructive interpretation of what I am capable of finding. Phenomenology at this point becomes hermeneutical (p. 250) (and even speculative, p. 252). Nonetheless, as an interpretive construction based on what I find of temporal process in my own experiencing, the reconstruction is still based on the descriptive features found of my human experiential subjectivity (one form of this necessity is explained on pp. 91-100), except that the interpretative re-description of it  "discloses" its transcendental character. However, one still has to ask by what terms the hermeneutical re-description transforms my experienced temporality into being transcendental. In short, whether reconstructive, or hermeneutical, there is obscurity and questionability in the actual disclosure of the true transcendental-that-constitutes.

A related issue is the second ambiguity I find in Luft's treatment, namely, in the way Husserl's lifeworld becomes the human cultural world. This is central to Luft's finding the lifeworld in possession of the hermeneutic diversity that he finds Gadamer so successful in treating. The difference introduced here is that now, in the melding of Husserl and Gadamer, the diversity of sense in different cultures has a transcendental subjective source, absent, Luft asserts, in Gadamer's work.

However, Luft here glosses over the distinction between essential structure and variant possibilities -- or, more fully put: between a) lifeworld as the ground of the experiential as such in The One Structure, in the primary sense-modal qualitative concreteness of experiential life, and b) the way the term lifeworld can also mean the concrete totality of a cultural world: the historical ensemble of communal practices, traditions, institutions, and endowments of a particular people. To dissolvethis distinction allows Luft to build an interpretation of Husserl that enables Husserl's work to converge with Gadamer's, transforming Husserl's phenomenology thereby into a theory of the intrinsic hermeneutic character of all experience; every human experience becomes herewith a "taking of" something as this or that, seemingly placing differences between different peoples' experiences on a ground-level, in basic perceptual experience itself as such.

However, to elide the distinction between constituted fundamentals and variant contingent realizations is to remove from divergent cultural worlds that within them which enables the distinction between what is there and what is not there in being experienced -- along with such "dimensions" as spatial and temporal determinacies (in phenomenological terms: the horizonalities) holding (geltend) in what in actuality is experientially there.[7] True, this basic distinction of the two senses of lifeworld is not always clear in Husserl's writings, published or unpublished, but it is nonetheless one that many see as implied and needed throughout his work. It seems to me, then, that rejecting the distinction to jettison one of the fundamental features in Husserl's whole program goes too far in accommodating Gadamer's work.

In short, while I find Luft's study to be both insightful and admirable, the "certain Husserl" whose work is represented there becomes somewhat less than the Husserl of his true consummate accomplishment. In addition, Luft opts for positive theoretical security over one of Husserl's primary features, namely, that in the end his work remains full of questioning and uncertainty. For such remaining questions, reiterated or newly emergent, are deeply illuminating. They necessitate beginning again in phenomenology, but at a stage of extraordinary advance and penetration into fundamentals on the basis of which further insights await being gained.

[1] There are also two subordinate series: 1) Husserliana Dokumente -- significant writings related to Husserl's own philosophic work, such as Husserl-Chronik,Denk- und Lebensweg Edmund Husserls, HuaDok I, edited by Karl Schuhman (Den Haag; Martinus Nijhoff, 1977); Eugen Fink, VI. Cartesianische Meditation, HuaDok II/1-2, edited by Hans Ebeling, Jann Holl, and Guy van Kerckhoven (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1988); and Edmund Husserl, Briefwechsel, HuaDok. III/1-10, edited by Karl Schuhmann with Elisabeth Schuhmann (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1994) -- and 2) Husserliana Materialien, manuscripts made available without the critical apparatus usual in the main line of Husserliana, such as Edmund Husserl, Späte Texte über Zeitkonstitution (1929-1934), Die C-Manuskripte. HuaMat VIII, edited by Dieter Lohmar (Dordrecht: Springer, 2006).

[2] Edmund Husserl, Zur phänomenologischen Reduktion, Texte aus dem Nachlass (1926-1935) Husserliana XXXIV, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2002.

[3] The term "constitute" here might hold an ambiguity, as meaning a) comprising or making up, or b) a generative "performance." I think Luft means it in the first sense, but the second sense quickly comes to the fore. Therein lies one of the principal problems I see here.

[4] This is also the way Luft distinguishes Husserl's "transcendental" inquiry from Kant's. Husserl goes beyond Kant's effort at the justification of the a priori in cognition to something on a fundamental level beneath cognition, namely, "the justification of the reality of the world," (p. 13, my emphasis). And Luft continues: "The Kantian original question thus becomes rephrased as the conditions of the possibility of the experience of the world" (ibid. my emphasis).

[5] Strictly speaking, we do not see the world as an object is seen; and we certainly cannot touch the world. The world is rather the all-embracing horizon about everything we see or touch as an object; we see and touch it in terms of the horizonalities, spatial and temporal, that are constitutive of it precisely as in the world.

[6] This is the way Husserl proceeds in his C-Manuscripts, published as Hua-Mat VIII, cited in footnote 2 above.

[7] Of course, though Husserl does not bring this up in his "Crisis"-texts, the materials from the period of his working on his Die Krisis der europäischen Wissenschaften und die transzendentale Phänomonenologie, Hua VI and Hua XXIX and XXXIX, these distinctions do come into play differently in some cultures, not as absent, but with a different framing of the absolute and the relative in regard to them, for example in the Hindu Upanishads.