Subjectivity and Selfhood in Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy

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Jari Kaukua and Tomas Ekenberg (eds.), Subjectivity and Selfhood in Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy, Springer, 2016, 294pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319269122.

Reviewed by Eric Hagedorn, St. Norbert College


This is a collection of essays presented at a conference held at the University of Uppsala in August 2012 entitled "Subjectivity, Selfhood, and Agency in the Arabic and Latin Traditions." According to its introduction, the volume as a whole seeks to improve our understanding of the development of the concept of 'self' throughout the medieval period as a way of determining whether there is a uniquely modern sense of self (as, for instance, Charles Taylor posited in Sources of the Self) and, if there is, how that conception differs from what preceded it. In particular, the editors claim that the volume will "yield us a more nuanced insight into the differences and common points between the various historical thinkers frequently cited in the discussions on selfhood and agency," as well as "assist us in discerning what the theoretical implications are of committing to certain philosophical viewpoints regarding human subjectivity and agency." (3)

Most of the essays focus primarily on a single thinker, with only four taking a broader view. Only one essay, Calvin Normore's "'Causa sui': Awareness and Choice in the Constitution of the Self", aims for anything like an overarching, synoptic vision, as Normore paints Descartes' notion of the self as res cogitans as having its origin in positions developed by Augustine, Avicenna, and Peter John Olivi.

Though the volume is not intentionally oriented around Normore's essay (it is the sixth of sixteen essays), that paper does serve as a sort of roadmap for much of the collection. Normore seeks to explain the genealogy of the conception of the self which Merleau-Ponty famously argued against, namely, the view that the self is somehow constituted by or identical with its reflective awareness, that "at the root of all our experiences and all our reflections, we find, then, a being which immediately recognizes itself, because it is its knowledge both of itself and of all things" (Normore quoting Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception, 91).

Normore interprets Descartes as holding that the self is a thinking and willing thing which is identical with its own thinking and willing: "for Descartes, the mind is not something which has thinking, but rather is itself thinking." (103) More specifically, we may say that Normore's Descartes holds that the self is its own willfully-directed reflexive thinking.  His Descartes believes the mind to be transparent and himself to be immediately aware of all his thoughts.  He believes this because he takes himself to just be this awareness of his own thoughts, an awareness which is somehow entirely entwined with the activity of the Cartesian will, which is involved in every act of judgment or awareness (including the awareness and judgment of one's own existence).

This Cartesian picture can be seen, Normore says, as the confluence of two distinct traditions of medieval philosophy: Augustine's focus on the role of attention in generating our experience and Avicenna's contrasting focus on our immediate awareness of ourselves prior to and/or absent of any experience. Normore notes that Descartes is not the first to bring these two traditions together into one account; Olivi also brought together these traditions in the late thirteenth century, producing a definition of personhood dependent on our attending to our awareness of ourselves. On Normore's story, then, Descartes's production of the modern conception of the self is merely an extension of Olivi's union of the Augustinian and Avicennan traditions.

At the end of his essay, Normore explicitly denies that this history is an accurate reconstruction of the avenues of influence that culminated in Descartes's account of personhood, but insists that thinking of this possible history of Descartes's doctrine might be nonetheless illuminating:

we have no reason whatever to think that Descartes was aware of Olivi's reworking -- and intertwining -- of the concepts of self and person. In this sense, the story I have been telling is a just-so story. It does, however, I hope, shed some light on how the conception of the self which Merleau-Ponty presents -- and opposes -- might have arisen, and in doing so shed some light on what might be lost in abandoning it. Even just-so stories can have a moral. (105)

Many of the other fifteen essays can be seen as sharpening the edges of Normore's "just-so story", drawing out additional details regarding the conceptions of agency, attention, awareness, and personhood in the medieval and early modern period; they may also be of help in better understanding what could be lost in abandoning these conceptions. There are two essays on Augustine, three which discuss Avicenna and the medieval Arabic tradition, and one essay each on Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, Walter Chatton, Martin Luther, Spinoza, Leibniz, and Hume. The remaining three essays are comparative essays covering a small set of figures: i) later medieval Augustinians, ii) later medieval interpreters of Aristotle's Politics, and iii) Descartes and Malebranche. The format of this review prevents full summaries or critical remarks about each essay; in the remainder I will primarily focus on a handful of essays in which the Augustinian and Avicennian themes appear most explicitly, giving only brief overviews of the remaining essays.

The first essay, "Augustine on Second-Order Desires and Persons" by Tomas Ekenberg, uses Harry Frankfurt's theory of personhood as a being with the capacity for second-order desires as a framework for better understanding Augustine's own views on freedom, desire, and personhood. Ekenberg focuses especially on Augustine's self-description in Confessions 8, where Augustine reports the conflict between his two wills, his inability to put aside that old pattern of action to which he had become accustomed; Ekenberg claims that we should see Augustine as an example of what Frankfurt calls the "unwilling addict": someone whose second-order volitions are unable to be made effective. Thus the unwilling addict wants to do X, even though she doesn't want to want to do X. As Ekenberg sees it, Augustine's problem is ultimately that his second-order desires aren't powerful enough to be made effective:

The problem [for Augustine] is not that he fails to act in accordance with his will, for he clearly does act in a way that, on some level, he does desire to act . . . what he has realized is that he both wants and does not want the desires that do constitute his will to constitute his will. The problem is therefore at the level of second-order volitions. The problem is not that he does not want his good first-order desire to be his will, but that he does not "fully" want this. He does not want it strongly enough, not fervently enough, or whole-heartedly enough. (20)

The essay only lightly touches on what Augustine takes to be the solution to the problem of the unwilling addict; for Augustine, only the transformation resulting from God's gift of grace can ultimately make these good second-order volitions effective.

The next essay, by Tamar Nawar, also treats of Augustine. Nawar's "The Augustinian Cogito and Materialist Theories of Mind" examines a passage from De Trinitate X where Augustine argues against materialism using an argument that Nawar compares to the arguments deployed by Descartes a millennium later. From the aforementioned text, Nawar extracts the following line of reasoning[1]:

(1) If S knows A's essence and F is an essential property of A, then S knows that F is an essential property of A.
(2) If S knows A, then S knows A's essence.
(3) The mind knows the mind.
(4) Therefore, the mind knows the mind's essence. [From (2), (3)]
(5) If S is not certain that p, then S does not know p.
(6) The mind is not certain that being corporeal is a property of the mind.
(7) Therefore, the mind does not know that being corporeal is a property of the mind. [From (5), (6)]
(8) If S does not know that F is a property of A, then S does not know that F is an essential property of A.
(9) The mind does not know that being corporeal is an essential property of the mind. [From (7), (8)]
(10) Being corporeal is not an essential property of the mind. [From (1), (4), (9) via modus tollens]

At least as Nawar understands Augustine's argument, however, Augustine's desired conclusion is not (10), but rather (11):

(11) Being corporeal is not a property of the mind.

Nawar sees no obvious way to make licit Augustine's inference of (11) from (10). Furthermore, he finds the conjunction of premises (2) and (3) to be dialectically inappropriate; surely any materialist opponent of Augustine will deny that the mind knows itself, at least in the sense of knowledge demanded by (2), where knowledge of a thing entails knowledge of its essence. (Nawar rightly points out that the conjunction of (5) and (6) is similarly suspect; the materialist could well turn the argument on its head by claiming that the mind doesn't know that it being incorporeal is a property of the mind either.) In conclusion Nawar declares Augustine's argument in De Trinitate X to be a failure, albeit a novel and interesting one.

Nawar's essay is followed by a trio of essays on selfhood in the Arabic tradition, primarily centered on the thought of Avicenna: Taneli Kukkonen's "Sources of the Self in the Arabic Tradition: Remarks on the Avicennan Turn," Luis Xavier López-Farjeat's "Avicenna on Non-Conceptual Content and Self-Awareness in Non-human Animals," and Jari Kaukua's "Self, Agent, Soul: Abū al-Barakāt al Baghdādī's Critical Reception of Avicennian Psychology." Kukkonen's essay mounts a search for precursors to Avicenna's views about self-knowledge. Avicenna's arguments have often been seen as an entirely innovative contribution to the history of philosophy, especially his famous "Flying Man" thought experiment, wherein he argues that a person suspended in midair with all sensory inputs removed would still nevertheless have an awareness of her own existence as a self. Kukkonen thoroughly demonstrates that, although it may be true that Avicenna's arguments have no obvious precursors in the Aristotelian philosophical tradition, a close reading of Arabic theological texts from the Ash'arite and Sufi traditions reveals a number of figures who posit some form of innate and indubitable self-knowledge, or who take the possession of such knowledge to be an ideal of the religious life.

In his essay, López-Farjeat attributes to Avicenna the view that non-human animals possess a non-conceptual form of awareness and knowledge of their environment which makes them able to appropriately react to their environment; some are even able to perceive properties such as "hostility, unfriendliness, or danger", properties which do not seem to be part of the content of any sensation (65). These claims about animal cognition are then put into conversation with contemporary discussions of animal cognition such as those of John McDowell and Daniel Dennett.

The trio of Avicenna-themed papers closes with Kaukua considering Abū al-Barakāt's criticisms of Avicenna's claims about our intuitive and indubitable awareness of self. Abū al-Barakāt identifies an inconsistency between (a) Avicenna's insistence that we are our awareness of our self and (b) Avicenna's identification of the self with the Aristotelian conception of soul. Given that the Aristotelian soul is responsible for many bodily functions of which we are not aware, such as digestion, growth, etc, it is difficult to see how (a) and (b) can consistently both be accepted. On Kaukua's telling, Abū al-Barakāt addresses this difficulty by maintaining both (a) and (b), and then providing a different account of awareness; according to this new conception of awareness, it turns out that we are in some sense occurrently aware of our digestive and nutritive acts as they are taking place, though we are typically not able to turn our attention upon these acts and thus the awareness of them is not stored in memory for future recollection. Kaukua recognizes that this is an account of awareness that will make "any phenomenologist worthy of the name . . . likely to cringe" and that claiming that we are aware of acts that cannot be attended to or remembered seems to "weaken the basis of those intuitions" (84) which prompted Avicenna to identify our self with our self-awareness in the first place, even as he praises the interest and historical contribution of Abū al-Barakāt's attempt.

Therese Scarpelli Cory investigates Aquinas's account of reflexive thought in her "The Reflexivity of Incorporeal Acts as Source of Freedom and Subjectivity in Aquinas." She convincingly argues that Aquinas believed that being incorporeal is both necessary and sufficient for having the capability of reflexive thought. In brief, on her account Aquinas holds that no cognitive operation which takes place in a bodily organ can have itself as its very own object; therefore, only an incorporeal operation, one which does not take place in a bodily organ, can be reflexive in the way acts of self-consciousness are. (An astute reader will notice that this only establishes that being incorporeal is necessary for being capable of reflexive thought; the argument that being incorporeal is sufficient for being capable of reflexive thought was less clear to this reader.)  Cory's paper suggests several interesting new lines of study; one which she doesn't comment on, though, is that her discussion appears to reveal a new Thomistic argument for the incorporeality of the human soul. The standard Thomistic argument for the incorporeality of the human soul is that no bodily cognitive operation could have universal content as its object (Summa Theologiae Ia, q. 75, a. 2 is the locus classicus for this argument); this argument from universal content has been subjected to significant criticism over the last few decades.[2] Though the argument from reflexive content may ultimately fall prey to criticisms similar to those brought against the content argument, I suspect that there is much of value to be learned by more carefully considering what precisely is required for a cognitive operation to be so turned upon itself that it can be its very own object.

In addition, there are four other essays on medieval figures. Jörg Alejandro Tellkamp's "Aping Logic? Albert the Great on Animal Mind and Action" details how Albert attributes to non-human animals "imperfect argumentation," a set of cognitive abilities that mimic syllogistic reasoning.

José Filipe Silva's "Self-Awareness and Perception in Augustinian Epistemology" details a debate between a variety of thirteenth- and fourteenth-century Christian thinkers concerning whether knowledge of the self is mediated via some kind of species (that is, a mental representation) of the soul's substance or rather via an awareness of the soul's acts.

Sonja Schierbaum's "Subject Experience and Self-Knowledge: Chatton's Approach and Its Problems" presents a careful analysis of Walter Chatton's account of our awareness of our own mental acts. Chatton (a contemporary and critic of the more well-known thinker William Ockham) argues that theories of self-awareness which attempt to explain self-knowledge via an awareness of one's own mental acts will be subject to a kind of vicious regress, as the awareness of the first-order act requires a second-order act, the awareness of which requires a third-order act, and so on. Schierbaum charitably presents Chatton's alternative account, according to which every mental act whatsoever can simultaneously generate an experience of the act's proper object and an experience of the act itself, although she believes that Chatton's account ultimately fails to account for all the phenomena of first-person awareness.

The medieval portion of the volume ends with Juhana Toivanen's "Beasts, Human Beings, or Gods? Human Subjectivity in Medieval Political Philosophy," which deals with medieval reactions to Aristotle's infamous claim in Book I of the Politics that living in community is necessary for human beings, and that those who are either unable to live in community or have no need to do so are either beasts or gods.

The final five essays deal with thinkers from the Reformation and Early Modern periods. Ilmari Karimies expounds Martin Luther's conception of human nature in his "Martin Luther's Early Theological Anthropology: From Parts of the Soul to the Human Person as One Subject"; much of his essay deals with how Luther understands the internal conflict within a Christian between flesh and spirit, between old sinful nature and new righteous nature, and how he seeks to explain the unity of these two "natures" within one person by appealing to the hypostatic union of human and divine natures in Christ.

Colin Chamberlain's "A Bodily Sense of Self in Descartes and Malebranche" compares and contrasts how those two thinkers explain the experience of one's body as being a part of oneself, the feeling that my body is somehow me (or, at least, a part of me). Chamberlain presents a careful survey of the emphasis that Descartes and Malebranche place on certain bodily sensations -- particularly sensations of pleasure and pain -- and the way in which each thinker insists that these sensations direct each of us to care for our own body; he concludes by suggesting that we should carefully reconsider what metaphysical role the body plays in Cartesian dualism.

In her "A View from Nowhere? The Place of Subjectivity in Spinoza's Rationalism", Julia Borcherding carefully reviews the axioms of the second part of Spinoza's Ethics to argue that, contrary to a popular and long-enduring interpretation, there is a significant role for human subjectivity to play in Spinoza's rationalist metaphysics; specifically, she argues that Spinozistic claims about the existence of particular finite modes and their attributes are ultimately justified by an appeal to our subjective experience of them.

Sebastian Bender's "Reflection and Rationality in Leibniz" tries to explain why it is that Leibniz believes that a mind is rational if and only if it is capable of reflective activity. On Bender's telling, Leibniz believes that a mind cannot engage in rational thought without relying on the ideas of substance, inherence, and identity, for these ideas are among the building blocks of propositional and inferential thought. But these ideas can only be grasped via reflection, by turning one's attention to one's own mentality. Bender closes his essay by defending Leibniz against the objection that this account is viciously circular.

The volume closes with Udo Thiel's "Hume on the Self and His 'Overall Philosophical Scheme'", in which Thiel spars with Galen Strawson over the broader philosophical implications of the change of heart that took place between when Hume presented his bundle theory of the self in the first book of his Treatise of Human Nature and when he apparently rejected this theory in the Appendix to Book III of the Treatise.

The above summaries of course do not begin to do justice to the ideas and arguments canvassed by the essays. Though it is not at all obvious that the essays presented here have fulfilled the editors' introductory promise of helping us determine whether there is a uniquely modern sense of self, many of the essays are nonetheless valuable contributions to the scholarly literature. Any scholar of medieval or early modern epistemology or philosophy of mind would be well-served by a careful reading of these papers.

[1] I have slightly rearranged and simplified Nawar's presentation of the argument.

[2] E.g., Robert Pasnau, "Aquinas and the Content Fallacy," Modern Schoolman 75 (1998): 293-314.