Subreption und Dialektik bei Kant: Der Begriff des Fehlers der Erschleichung in der Philosophie des 18. Jahrhunderts

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Hanno Birken-Bertsch, Subreption und Dialektik bei Kant: Der Begriff des Fehlers der Erschleichung in der Philosophie des 18. Jahrhunderts, Frommann-Holzboog, 2006, 203pp., €76.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783772823763.

Reviewed by Riccardo Pozzo, Universitä di Verona


The origin of Europe's intellectual identity lies in the translatio studiorum, the transmission of a common heritage of learning from Antiquity to Modernity that derives from Greek, Latin, and Arab and defines itself during the Middle Ages alongside the linguae vulgares by setting up disciplinary lexica for all languages of Europe. Linguistic signs are the main vehicle for exchanging ideas. With their transformations and hybridizations, they are the key for shaping cultures within the dynamism of their historical actuality. Languages are fundamental for Europeans wanting to work together. In fact, opting for multilingualism has proven to be the best way to bring European citizens closer to each other, because languages are not something we can put on and off, they are our own skin, an organ we need for surviving. Languages are the very heart of the unity in diversity and are all equally necessary for pointing out the essence of Europe's intellectual identity as opposed to intellectual identities that have been shaped by the monolingual option, as it is the case, e.g., with the US, China, and India.

The history of concepts looks into Europe's intellectual identity according to the etymological sense of the German verb verstehen (which is based on the Greek epistēme): to stand over in order to have a more comprehensive vision. The history of concepts looks into the development of disciplinary lexica, which arise from the necessity of maintaining a cultural tradition's continuity in the face of the need to transcribe it into new contexts. When Boethius, e.g., set himself to translate Aristotle into Latin in the sixth century, he was motivated to do so in order, first, to keep alive the Latin classical tradition and, second, to modernize it by transcribing it into the new contexts opened up by the paradigmatic acceptance of Aristotelianism. When Kant chose to reintroduce Greek terms such as phenomenon and noumenon he did it in order, first, to keep up the tradition of writing philosophy in German, a tradition that had its classical origins in Master Eckhart and Luther, and second, to revitalize the tradition by transcribing it into the new context of the Copernican Revolution in the theory of knowledge.

Defended at Jena in 2001 under the direction of Wolfgang Welsch and Gottfried Gabriel (the latter has edited the last volumes of the Historisches Wörterbuch der Philosophie initiated by Joachim Ritter), Hanno Birken-Bertsch's dissertation follows the methodology of the history of concepts. It is entirely dedicated to subreptio, a Latin term that designates an interdisciplinary concept, which has both a juridical (27-33) and a philosophical history (34-67). Someone commits a fraud of subreption in the juridical sense when he gains an advantage by concealing important facts in a petition (as for dispensation or favor, which in certain cases nullifies the grant). Related to this is the fraud of obreption, in which somebody asserts untrue facts to an official. In contemporary informal logic, the vitium subreptionis corresponds to the mistake of setting up a categorical syllogism with an undistributed middle. The reason for such an argument to be taken as valid is probably the tendency to switch the middle and the predicate in the major premise. People hear "All [predicate] is [middle term]," but switch it to "All [middle term] is [predicate]." They hear, for example, "All conservatives believe in private property" but take it to mean "Anyone who believes in private property is a conservative," treating the belief in private property as entailing a belief in conservatism.[1]

Jungius and Leibniz were the first to talk of a vitium subreptionis in definiendo, which occurs when an expression is assigned different definitions. Wolff distinguished a vitium subreptionis in experiundo, which takes place when a state of affairs that has been inferred synthetically is presented as grounded in sensation und thus open to philosophical analysis. Baumgarten pointed out the cases in which subreption lets us consider perceptions to be no more than sensations ("perceptiones pro sensationibus per vitium subreptionis habitae." -- Metaphysica, 4th edn., #545), which led Meier in #6 of the Beyträge zu der Lehre von den Vorurtheilen to take the strong empiricist stance of declaring fallacious the attempt of someone who wishes to infer something from experience while taking an intuitive judgment for a sensation, together with which, however, he has hastily mixed other sensations (59-60).

Kant took up the issue in the Dissertation of 1770 in which he mentioned the vitium subreptionis metaphysicum of surreptitiously inferring the spatio-temporality of things in themselves (69-91). Birken-Bertsch dedicates interesting remarks to the occurrences of Subreption in the Reflexionen of the 1770s, focusing on the confusing similarity between a petitio phenomenorum and a petitio noumeronum in Reflexion 4644 (93-94).

In the Critique of Pure Reason, the term occurs eight times in the first edition and six in the second edition (due to the deletion of the fourth Paralogism). A subreption of sensation (A36/B53) takes place when appearances, in which predicates inhere, are taken to have an objective reality, whereas objective reality is entirely absent insofar as the appearances are merely empirical -- e.g. the perfume of a rose could only in an "empirical" understanding be taken for an appearance of the rose as a thing in itself (101). In the Transcendental Dialectic, subreptions generally occur when regulative principles are taken as constitutive, which happens when the opposite of a certain proposition either simply contradicts the subjective conditions of thought but not the object, or when both propositions of an apagogical proof contradict each other only under a subjective condition that is falsely held to be objective (A791/B819). Birken-Bertsch notes (104) that this is what happens to theses and antitheses of the Antinomies of Transcendental Cosmology, which are based on the condition of "transcendental idealism" (the key to solving the cosmological dialectic), namely that everything intuited in space or in time, hence all objects of an experience possible for us, are nothing but appearances, which have outside our thoughts no existence grounded in itself. Subreptions inevitably take place in the arguments of those who maintain the transcendental signification of "realism," which makes the modifications of our sensibility into things subsisting in themselves, and hence makes mere representations into things in themselves (A490/B518 and following).

Kant makes it clear that "all errors of subreption are always to be ascribed to a defect in judgment, never to understanding or reason" (A643/B671). In Reflexion 5059, he explains the subreption of judgment to be fundamentally based on the premise that we know only predicates. If in a judgment only predicates provide us with knowledge and if judgments are composed of subjects and predicates, this means we must also have "predicates with an indeterminate subject" (104).

Kant states in Reflexion 5553 that under this quite interesting perspective, the whole Doctrine of Paralogisms becomes nothing else than "transcendental subreption, because our judgment on objects and the unity of consciousness in them are taken for a perception of the unity of the subject." Which gives us again, however, an error of judgment, not an error of pure reason (111). Birken-Bersch's concluding question, then, is quite intriguing: whether it would not be exactly correct to consider the main objective of transcendental idealism to lie in the avoidance of subreption (115 and following).

In Reflexion 1018, the vitium subreptionis practicum is said to occur when "somebody takes motives of action that rest on the impulses of the senses for actions based on principles" (122), and #27 of the Critique of Judgment (B97) makes it clear that the origin of our feeling of the sublime lies in respecting a determination of man that is considered to correspond to an object "by means of a certain subreption" (126). This well documented and well argued little volume closes with an excursus on the role played by subreption among post-Kantian philosophers such as Reinhold, Fülleborn, Krug, and Hamilton, as well as a general argument encompassing all analogies of subreption and their dialectic (155-161)

[1] David Kelley, The Art of Reasoning, 3rd edn. (New York: Norton 1998), 243-44.