Substance and the Fundamentality of the Familiar. A Neo-Aristotelian Mereology

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Ross D. Inman, Substance and the Fundamentality of the Familiar. A Neo-Aristotelian Mereology, Routledge, 2018, 304 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138065598.

Reviewed by Anna Marmodoro, University of Oxford


Ross Inman's book is a fine attempt to pursue afresh the question of what is fundamental in our ontology. The project is ambitious, well thought out, carefully investigated with attention to the detail and mastery of the literature -- and the book is very well written. In essence, it can be read as arguing for the merits of a certain criterion of fundamentality that Inman commends as yielding a view that is "worth taking seriously and deserves a place at the table as a viable yet underappreciated metaphysic of material objects" (p. 6). For Inman, as he stresses several times, the most significant result of endorsing his criterion of fundamentality is that medium-sized entities too count as fundamental substances. This is what the book's title emphasises: "the fundamentality of the familiar", where the familiar is literally what we are most acquainted with in our everyday life: ordinary material objects, among which the prime candidates for being substances are living beings. But what is most distinctive, I would say, about the book is that that it puts forward a "mixed" view of what is fundamental: in Inman's words, "a mixed view which includes among the class of fundamental entities certain intermediate composites (living organisms and human persons) as well as the micro-entities that compose all composite objects save the intermediate substances" (p. 279). What are, metaphysically, these "certain intermediate composites" and "micro-entities that compose all composite objects save the intermediate substances"? Inman explains that "substances are  . . .  either mereologically simple or metaphysically prior to their parts" (94). So, the core concept to understand what counts for Inman as a substance, is that of parthood: substances are entities lacking parts, either because mereologically simple, or because their parts are inseparable from the whole (p. 101).

Thus, on Inman's view, both mereological simples and composite beings are, on a par, fundamental entities, on account of the latter lacking separable parts. Key here is Inman's implicit assumption that lack of separable parts and lack of parts tout court are one and the same criterion of substantiality, capturing the same type of metaphysical simplicity. (The dialectical opponent will want to argue that lack of parts and lack of separable parts are two independent and even incompatible criteria; but space does not permit me here to develop the argument.)

What does it mean, metaphysically, for a composite to lack separable parts according to Inman? He explains: it means being "unified in the right kind of way" (p. 98 and elsewhere). Assuming for Inman's argument's sake that being composite for a substance amounts to having proper parts (that is another implicit assumption in the book on which there is room for debate), how then is a substance which has proper parts "unified in the right kind of way"? To articulate the answer to this question, Inman makes reference to Verity Harte's work on Plato's metaphysics, and writes that

the unity that is said to characterise a substantial whole [in the right kind of way] is precisely one that stems from its serving as the essential ground for each of its proper parts. The proper parts of substances are, to borrow an apt phrase from Verity Harte (2002: 165) employed in the context of Plato's wholes, "structure-laden" in that "they get their identity only in the context of the structure of which they are part. (pp. 101-2)

But Inman should not want to explicate the unity of a composite substance in terms of how Harte explains the unity of a Platonic whole, because Harte's position suffers from difficulties of which he does not seem to be aware. When saying that a whole is unified when its parts are structure-laden, Harte assumes that the structure yields the metaphysical unification of its parts, by being essential to both the parts and the whole (2002: 161). She, however, illustrates the view with an example that appears to undermine the metaphysical stance she wants to endorse. She takes a dinner party as her example of a whole, with the guests being the proper parts of that whole. She writes that "guests [at the dinner party] will be essentially things that are seated in this way. The parts -- the guests -- are thus not identifiable independently of the structure of the whole they compose" (2002: 161). The problem with Harte's view as exemplified by the dinner party example is that the party's guests are essentially human beings; human beings cannot become essentially something other than what they are -- they cannot become essentially guests. The role of being a guest is essential to the dinner party, but human beings have this role accidentally: the invitees are essentially human beings and accidentally guests. The individuality of the guests as human beings undermines the unity of the party. So, if we take this example to capture Harte's thought, her view cannot be other than this: what unifies the guests (the parts) into a whole (the dinner party) are the relations that hold between them, and not their essential transformation from being human beings to being guests at the party (which is impossible).

One might wonder whether Inman would be better served by a different account of the unity of substance in the same (conceptual) neighbourhood as that of Harte's; this is Kathrin Koslicki's account. She holds that:

For a whole to be unified is just for its material components to satisfy the structural constraints posed by the formal components associated with the kind to which it belongs. To illustrate, with respect to the kind H2O-molecule, a successful case of composition requires two hydrogen atoms and one oxygen atom to enter into the configuration of chemical bonding that is required to form a particular specimen of the kind in question. (2013: 187; see also 2008: 7)

Both Harte's (if we take her example at face value) and Koslicki's accounts of the unity of substance deliver a relational whole, which to my understanding is not "unified in the right kind of way" for Inman's purposes, because relations only relate distinct individuals, and don't unify them, individuating a whole. If Inman endorses Harte's or Koslicki's account, he has not provided any successful explanation of the (metaphysical) inseparability of the parts of a substance that he has set as a criterion for the fundamentality of ordinary objects (e.g. although the seating places around the table are inseparable from the dinner party, the guests are not). If, on the other hand, Inman's account differs from Harte's and Koslicki's and the structure-laden approach, then the reference to Harte is misleading to the reader, and an alternative account is needed.

Let us explore another lead Inman gives us to understand how composite substances may be composite and yet lacking separable parts -- thus being unified "in the right kind of way". He writes that, "If wholes are prior to the parts in that they rigidly ground their existence and identity, it follows that no proper part of a composite object is capable of existing independently of that very whole" (p. 93). The reader would want at this point an account of why this is the case, and here Inman turns to Aristotle and Theodore Scaltsas' (1994) interpretation of the unity of Aristotelian substances, known in the literature as substantial holism. Substantial holism accounts for the unity of a composite substance in terms of the substantial form operating as a principle that re-identifies the parts of the substance, thereby changing their identity and number.

I don't understand why Inman wants to "downgrade" Aristotle's account of the unity of substance (understood in terms of substantial holism) to an "intuition", about which he writes, "of course the earlier considerations do not amount to an argument in favour of the Aristotelian intuition, which is precisely why I persist in calling it an intuition" (p. 107). This seems a self-undermining stance for Inman, who is seeking to give an account of how composite substances are unified "in the right kind of way", namely by lacking separable parts. Inman appears to be attracted both to Harte's interpretation of Plato as positing that substances have structure-laden parts and to Scaltsas' interpretation of Aristotle as holding that the substantial form makes the parts identity-dependent on the whole.  But he doesn't appreciate how these two accounts of the parts-whole relation pull in different directions; and further, doesn't realise that only the Aristotelian one can underpin the type of unity of substance Inman wants. If he cannot provide an account of the required dependence of the parts on the whole substance, Inman is left bereft of the means to justify his key thesis in the book that "substances are metaphysically fundamental and are either mereologically simple or metaphysically prior to their parts" (p. 94).

A further issue arises in connection with Inman's conception of the fundamentality of composite substances. He appears to think that a neo-Aristotelian committed to an hylomorphic account of substances won't be able to hold that substances are fundamental in the sense of being metaphysically prior to their parts, because this "conflicts with the fact that a composite substance is (rigidly) grounded in its form and matter for what it is fundamentally" (p. 100). But both the diagnosis of the (alleged) difficulty and the solution Inman gives are problematic. He writes:

I do think that a weaker sense of the fundamentality of composite substances can be preserved for the proponent of hylomorphism who favours Substantial Priority. Following the lead of some neo-Aristotelians, this would involve distinguishing between the relation of parthood and the sui-generis relation of constituency. As the only elements of the substantial compound that factor into its real definition and determines the identity of the compound, form and matter are constituents and not, strictly speaking proper parts of the hylomorphic compound. This does indeed seem to be an intuitive (albeit hard to define) difference between the relations that obtain between a living organism and its metaphysical constituents (substantial form and prime matter). (p. 100, my emphasis)

Inman does not explain the metaphysical difference between the relations of parthood and constituency that is supposedly crucial to marrying hylomorphism and substantial priority (nor does his reference in a footnote to David Oderberg's work include an account of their difference, but a mere statement of their difference). Claiming that their difference is intuitive (without explaining the nature of each relation) is bound to leave the reader wanting more.

Inman devotes a large part of the book to assessing the theoretical benefits of his proposed view; in sum, he commends it to us as theoretically fruitful, in that it affords a unified solution to various puzzles in metaphysics, while also preserving many of our pre-philosophical beliefs about material objects.

As with any attempt to engage with a core and difficult question in metaphysics such as that of fundamentality, even a "substantial" book in size and breadth as Inman's does not and cannot address all the issues. But even the reader who might have reasons to disagree with Inman's conclusions will find the book a very worthwhile read, and will have to engage with the many powerful arguments that Inman presents, which I could only touch upon here.




Harte, V., 2002, Plato on Parts and Wholes, Oxford University Press.


Koslicki, K., 2008, The Structure of Objects, Oxford University Press.


--- 2013, “Substance, independence, and unity” in Aristotle on Method and Metaphysics, Palgrave Macmillan, pp.169-195.


Scaltsas, T., 1994. Substances and Universals in Aristotle's Metaphysics. Cornell University Press.