Subverting Aristotle: Religion, History, and Philosophy in Early Modern Science

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Craig Martin, Subverting Aristotle: Religion, History, and Philosophy in Early Modern Science, Johns Hopkins University Press, 2014, 262pp., $54.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781421413167.

Reviewed by David Clemenson, University of St. Thomas (MN)


This book's main thesis seems well summarized by the following passage:

(A)  The motivations of seventeenth-century innovators in natural philosophy, whether Protestant or Catholic, were deeply religious. Their abandonment of Peripatetic philosophy arose, at least in part, from the conviction that the best historical studies of the day demonstrated that Aristotle deviated from Christianity giving permission to seek more pious alternatives. (p. 177)

(A) seems to entail

(B)  Most seventeenth-century innovators in natural philosophy, or the most important and influential ones, were motivated mainly by Christian faith.

The book offers no convincing argument for (B). It does not attempt to adjudicate the long-standing debate on the relationship of seventeenth century science to religion, and it presents no evidence that Christianity played an important role in motivating the scientific work either of such luminaries as Galileo and Newton or of the majority of seventeenth-century scientists. The only support offered for (B) is a series of quotations from seventeenth-century authors charging Aristotle or some of his doctrines with impiety. Except for Robert Boyle, the quoted authors are not famous as scientists; Francis Bacon, for example, is known less for his natural philosophy than for his inductive logic and philosophy of science. But even if all these authors had been scientists of Newton's stature, the quoted texts would not establish (B).

Passage (A) also seems to assert that part of the reason for seventeenth-century innovators' abandonment of Aristotelianism was their knowledge of historical studies demonstrating Aristotle's deviation from Christianity on questions such as the contingency of the existence of the heavens. But since, as Martin himself notes, these deviations had been common knowledge during the Middle Ages, when Aristotle's authority was at its height, there seems little reason to think that such historical demonstrations help explain seventeenth-century innovators' rejection of Aristotelian natural philosophy.

Boyle is Martin's best example of a major seventeenth-century natural philosopher whose opposition to some of Aristotle's doctrines was, at least in part, religiously motivated. But it is not evident that the charges of religious error Boyle leveled against Aristotle in his early work Essay of the Holy Scriptures had any effect on his assessment of Aristotelian natural philosophy. That Boyle was just as capable as Aquinas or Scotus (each of whom rejected certain points of Aristotle's teaching) of distinguishing philosophy of nature from philosophy of religion is indicated by some texts from the Essay that accuse Epicurus and Lucretius of holding impious views. These atomists' errors about religion did not dampen Boyle's enthusiasm for their doctrine that natural phenomena are best explained as the effects of pressure or local motion of variously shaped minute solid bodies. If Boyle's religious convictions can explain why he rejected the hylomorphism of the non-Christian Aristotle while accepting the corpuscularianism of the non-Christians Epicurus and Lucretius, it is not evident from Martin's book.

Martin calls the proposition

(C)  Aristotle's philosophy is incompatible with Christianity.

"hardly controversial" (p. 1). He is right, if by (C) he means "some philosophical propositions asserted by Aristotle contradict some Christian dogmas"; read that way, any sentence resulting from substitution of some ancient philosopher's name for "Aristotle" in (C) is likely to be true. But if (C) means that Christianity contradicts the foundations of Aristotle's metaphysics, theory of knowledge, or ethics, then it seems at best problematic. It may well be that in these areas Christian theology is better served by some version of Aristotelianism than by any of its ancient or modern rivals. But this is a peripheral criticism, since the book is not intended as a work of philosophy or theology.

Though imperfect, the book introduces the reader to a wide range of obscure authors, and provides many useful citations of primary and secondary literature. Almost anyone would learn something by reading it.