Suffering and Virtue

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Michael S. Brady, Suffering and Virtue, Oxford University Press, 2018, 178pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198812807.

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, College of St. Benedict/St. John's University


For creatures like us, suffering is an inevitable part of life. Yet we have clashing intuitions about its value: on the one hand, all suffering seems bad; this is part of the very notion of suffering. On the other hand, some suffering seems to be good, because it can fortify us in various ways. In this book, Michael Brady defends the value of some suffering because of its role in cultivating and expressing virtues that are essential to a good life for human beings. Brady's extremely clear and careful account of suffering and its value is a demonstration of how philosophy can be therapeutic: if we can absorb the lessons he is offering, we may find our lives more bearable and more meaningful.

To head off an obvious objection right away: Brady takes care to emphasize that his thesis is only that some suffering is necessary for virtue. Much suffering is truly meaningless and just plain bad, undermining the development of any virtue that might redeem it. Nevertheless, he argues, there are kinds and circumstances of suffering that contribute to a good life.

The logic of the main argument goes like this: If virtues give rise to correct responses to circumstances, and (inevitably) some circumstances are bad, and the appropriate response to bad circumstances is suffering, then if we are (to be) virtuous, we must suffer. Thus, if virtues make life good, then suffering is part of the good life.

Brady begins his defense of this argument with an account of suffering. He argues that suffering happens only when we have a particular kind of attitude toward negative affective states: an occurrent desire that the state in question not exist. To fill in this account, Brady gives a detailed analysis of the relevant feeling of unpleasantness. He claims that unpleasantness is not a property of sensations, but of the composite experience consisting of the relation between a sensation and the desire that it not be occurring. Putting this together with the account of suffering, he gets: "A subject suffers when and only when she has (i) an unpleasant experience consisting of a sensation S and a desire that S not be occurring, and (ii) an occurrent desire that this unpleasant experience not be occurring" (55). This may seem unnecessarily complex, but it both fits the respective appeals of internalism and externalism, and avoids the worst objections to either. I find particularly appealing the fact that alleviating suffering could involve stopping either the sensation, or the first-order desire that the sensation not occur. Both responses can be appropriate.

With a full account of suffering in hand, Brady turns to making the connection between suffering and virtue. The heart of Chapter 3 is an argument that suffering can constitute virtuous motives. Brady begins with the idea that virtues are dispositions to have certain motives which, together with appropriate understanding, enable a person to be reliably successful in achieving important human ends. Suffering in such forms as grief, remorse, pain, and hunger seem to represent appropriate responses to bad situations, and they move us to alleviate those bad situations. So suffering itself can be a virtuous motive; it moves us to repair damage or otherwise alleviate situations of disvalue.

The most important objection to the admittedly radical claim that physical and emotional suffering can itself be virtuous goes like this: How can the claim that suffering is a virtue -- where virtues are by nature good -- be reconciled with the claim that suffering is always bad? Brady writes, "something that is intrinsically bad can nevertheless form part of a relation that is intrinsically good, because it is fitting or appropriate" (80). If we understand intrinsic goodness as "non-instrumental" goodness then "we can allow that forms of suffering -- which are in a strict sense bad -- can be intrinsically good when directed towards something that is itself intrinsically bad" (81). So suffering, which on Brady's account is a desire that a bad feeling go away, can be both intrinsically bad and intrinsically good: the feeling itself is intrinsically bad, but desiring that it go away is intrinsically good.

In Chapter 4, Brady argues that some kinds of suffering are instrumental to the development of other virtues -- in particular, virtues we can group into the categories of vulnerability and strength of character, respectively. Given that the human condition is such that any sort of worthwhile achievement requires strength of character and that we will inevitably encounter illness and disability, a good life for us will require virtues of strength (e.g. patience, courage, resilience) and virtues of vulnerability (e.g. adaptability, creativity, intimacy). Brady argues that suffering is necessary -- though not sufficient -- for the development of these virtues. Without strength of character, our efforts to achieve things of value will not succeed, and that can't be construed as a good life. Without virtues of vulnerability, "disorder and malfunction will win the day" (90), and that also cannot be construed as a good life.

Chapter 5 is perhaps the keystone of the book. In it, Brady makes a case that suffering is essential to moral virtues (such as compassion and benevolence) and to wisdom. He also treats crucial objections that parallel major objections to virtue-theoretic theories of theodicy, the kinds of objections that may lurk in readers' heads from the beginning.

He begins with a Christian perspective on the relationship between suffering and moral virtue, since this has clear parallels to his own view. The basic idea is that a world where there has been suffering is necessary to valuable virtues, and a world lacking these virtues would be less good than a world that included them. And if suffering is necessary to developing these virtues, then suffering is valuable. Brady shares this final claim, but recognizes that traditional theodicies are vulnerable to two major objections: First, they fail to explain the amount and extent of suffering, especially in the life of particular sufferers. Second, they fail to take suffering seriously enough, and by advocating acceptance of suffering actually contribute to the oppressive structures that cause it.

His reply to the first objection is thorough and reasonably convincing. He emphasizes that it is not just the suffering of others that is necessary for developing virtue; we must also experience pain at their suffering -- thus suffer ourselves -- in order to be moved to alleviate it, and thus develop our virtue. The idea is supposed to be that even if the suffering of others can't be redeemed by its value in our virtue development, at least our own suffering at their suffering does have value. This may not be convincing on its own, but when combined with a reminder that his claim is only that some suffering is necessary for virtue and is therefore valuable, it gains some strength. I was persuaded when Brady noted that since he is not proposing a theodicy, he need not -- and does not -- justify the existence or persistence of tremendous suffering, either globally or for individuals.

His reply to the second objection comes after he has made the case that suffering is necessary for the "overarching" virtue of wisdom. The main claim of this section is that suffering provides the occasion and motivation for the reflection that is the heart of wisdom. Reflection is the core of wisdom because it assists and promotes all the other elements of wisdom: understanding and appreciation of value, the ability to make good decisions, humility, and compassion.

To end the chapter, Brady turns to the second major objection to his view: Isn't it ignoring or legitimizing oppressive structures? Relatedly, isn't it insensitive to suffering people to point out to them that their suffering is an occasion for the development of virtue? And doesn't this view lend support to the "tyranny of positive thinking" and put an extra burden on sufferers to put on a happy face? Brady offers four replies to this set of objections.

The first is that suffering is more likely to produce virtue in circumstances where sufferers are supported and not oppressed. This goes by quickly, but I take it to mean that, since suffering is only valuable if it leads to virtue, then if oppression reduces the likelihood that suffering will produce virtue, it is unlikely that oppression produces the kind of suffering that redeems it from its intrinsic badness. Virtues of strength are only cultivated when the suffering leads to practice in overcoming it; under oppression, this is less likely to happen. Thus, the view does not find value in oppression.

The second reply is based on ideas from Chapter 6, so I will return to it. The third reply Brady makes speaks to the charge that it's insensitive to tell sufferers that they should use their suffering to cultivate virtue. He argues that taking a positive attitude toward (one's own) suffering is conducive to better outcomes, particularly to happiness. So not encouraging sufferers to do so (by cultivating virtues of strength and vulnerability) is actually what demonstrates insensitivity.

Finally, Brady notes, the way in which we encourage sufferers to see the opportunities for virtue will affect whether doing so is insensitive or not. Given that negative attitudes toward suffering are often warranted (within reasonable limits), encouraging people to ignore the negative is likely insensitive (at best). But acknowledging the badness of the suffering and compassionately assisting the suffer to deal with it may not be problematic. For example, encouraging virtues of strength may be burdensome when encouraging virtues of vulnerability may not.

The final chapter discusses the role of suffering in cultivating social virtues, arguing that it can have value because of the role it plays in communication between group members. This is significant because of the connection between healthy groups and the circumstances in which individual virtue can develop. He focuses on suffering's role in legal punishment, love, and tests of virtue.

Regarding punishment, Brady argues that on a communicative view, legal punishment can reflect both justice and care because it expresses the state's commitment to the values it is formed to protect, and also (done right) aims to reform the wrongdoer by promoting better recognition and understanding of the wrong and the values behind it, and (hopefully) motivating repentance and reform.

Brady also claims that suffering can communicate love. If we think of love as (in part) a disposition to respond appropriately to the value of the people we love, then suffering for them can be seen as an appropriate response to valuing them, thus communicating that value. Brady contends that this can strengthen relationships when those for whom a lover suffers respond by making sure that the suffering is not in vain.

Finally, Brady contends that suffering can have value as a test of virtue. In a religious context, this can manifest as a test of faith, as in the story of Job in the Bible. (It isn't clear to me, however, what the value of tests of faith of this sort really are. But perhaps there's a parallel to love here: if you're willing to suffer for what you value, you demonstrate quite directly how much you value it.) For a secular analogue, Brady turns to initiation rites (in particular, ones that involve suffering). Submitting to such rites (within reason) demonstrates submission to authority and commitment to the group, generating solidarity. It also shows who has the virtues the group values. This is important because we need to know who belongs in the group in order for it to provide all the goods group membership provides.

Returning, finally, to Brady's second reply to the objection that his view might ignore or legitimize oppression: he argues that since it is only healthy social structures that can ultimately resist oppression, we must value the kinds of suffering that generate social virtues like justice, love, and solidarity in order to undo oppression. To the extent that suffering is essential to the formation of healthy social groups and institutions, repressing altogether the idea that suffering has value undermines the project of constructing strong social structures.

Thus, the overall argument is that suffering is essential for virtue in three ways. First, some suffering is itself constitutive of virtue, because it is a sign that systems designed to detect and repair physical, emotional, or relational damage are functioning well. Second, some suffering is necessary for virtues that serve individuals well and cultivate wisdom. Third, some suffering strengthens relationships by conveying our virtues to others.

I kept wondering, though, whether a world that never needed certain virtues in the first place wouldn't be better than a world that does need them. Wouldn't it be better if we never needed compassion or charity? Brady implicitly answers this worry when describing an idea from John Hick's theodicy. Hick considers what a world without suffering would be like. It would by hypothesis be a world in which God intervened to prevent all suffering, thus promoting maximum happiness. Although Brady does not develop this vision, I suspect that following out the idea would yield a world that might be better, but is not recognizably ours, and the inhabitants are not recognizably human.

Thus, the main idea that given the human condition, some suffering has value can still stand. And indeed, I believe that it is an important insight. I wish Brady developed this point further, actually, and spent more time considering the problems caused by our overlooking or flatly denying his central claim. No doubt there are many, but one that comes to mind is the fragility of children, who are suffering from depression and anxiety at alarming rates because they haven't had as many opportunities to develop virtues of strength and vulnerability that the right kinds of suffering early on might have led them to develop.[1]

One might argue that if we take Brady's account seriously, the anxiety and depression many people face should be seen as an opportunity for virtue development, and should thus be understood as valuable. And this brings up a second wish I had: that there were a more developed account of when suffering is valuable and when it isn't. My point about preventing anxiety and depression takes these as suffering that should have been prevented, but in order to do so, other forms of suffering should have been faced earlier in people's lives. How do we decide which kinds of suffering to accept, and which to prevent? I would have liked to see more about this.

On the whole, however, I found the main idea valuable and well-argued. Brady attends to all of the important objections I could think of, his writing is extremely clear, and the account incorporates empirical research well. The book is an excellent piece of practical philosophy.

[1] See, e.g., Julie Lythcott-Haims, How to Raise an Adult. New York: Henry Holt, 2016.