Suicide: The Philosophical Dimensions

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Michael Cholbi, Suicide: The Philosophical Dimensions, Broadview Press, 2011, 191pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN: 9781551119052.

Reviewed by Dennis R. Cooley, North Dakota State University


Michael Cholbi's Suicide: The Philosophical Dimensions is a well-written, thoughtful introduction to a sensitive and perennial moral issue. Cholbi critically examines arguments that suicide is always morally impermissible, can be impermissible in certain circumstances and yet permissible in other situations, and that suicide can be a duty in some rare cases. He also tries to find a practical definition of suicide that is consistent with standard intuitions. Cholbi incorporates a range of historical arguments into his work to provide a good overview of the subject area, as well as to support his individual positions. The end result is a conscientiously crafted book that provides excellent grounds for his conclusions.

Given the intended audience for Suicide -- undergraduates and those investigating the area for the first time -- it might appear unfair to critically analyze any part of the project. However, Cholbi's work merits careful scrutiny because he spends time and energy carefully crafting and supporting his positions. To merely state that it is a nice book for beginners would not recognize the value of Cholbi's endeavor and would be insulting to Cholbi's work. Therefore, I will consider what is one of the more significant positions he takes, viz., the definition of suicide. For what he intends the definition to do, it might prove too high a standard at times.

According to Cholbi, suicide is self-killing, but merely killing oneself does not entail that a suicide has occurred. Those who smoke, eat the wrong types of food, or do not take exercise can be thought of as killing themselves but few would think that they are committing suicide. There has to be a greater commitment to the person's death by the person than that. More precisely:

(S) Suicide is intentional self-killing: a person's act is suicidal if and only if the person believes that the act, or some causal consequence of that act, would make her death likely and she engaged in the behavior to intentionally bring about her death (p. 21).

Although Cholbi spends much time defining all the relevant terms in this formulation, the most interesting part is what it means to intentionally bring about one's own death. This is also a great concern of Cholbi's as he uses approximately eight pages in his slim volume to develop and defend his definition.

An outcome, such as death, may be intentional although it is not intended, according to Cholbi. That is, a person can intentionally kill herself yet not intend that she dies:

A person's self-killing is intentional just in case her death has her rational endorsement in the circumstances in which she acts so as to bring about her death (p. 28).

This definition fits Cholbi's intuition about a case he labels "Foxhole Jumper" (p. 16). The foxhole jumper is an unfortunate soldier who throws himself on a live grenade in order to save the lives of other members of his unit. Before he performs his leap, Foxhole Jumper is aware of the consequences of his action, but does it anyway because he also understands that if he does not act in such a manner, then the others will be killed in the blast.

According to Cholbi, Foxhole Jumper commits suicide. In fact, although the soldier did not intend it, his death was intentional because of his rational endorsement of that probable outcome.

He knows that dying is the near certain result of his jumping on the grenade, and absorbing the grenade blast is his means to saving his comrades. And in that split second in which Foxhole Jumper jumps on the grenade, the foreseeability of his death almost certainly informs his deliberation, even if that deliberation takes place so rapidly as to nearly escape his notice. And unless he is also gravely depressed, for instance, his death counts in his mind as a reason against jumping on the grenade. He jumped on the grenade despite this danger. In essence, Foxhole Jumper endorses his own death, neither as a means nor as an end, but as a foreseeable result of the act he chooses as a means: a death that has his rational approval (p. 27).

Some unpacking of this rather long quotation is useful in seeing what needs to be done in order to have a rational endorsement of one's own death. First, the person must foresee that his action will be a significant cause of his death. If Foxhole Jumper thought that he would merely receive a serious but non-fatal injury, then there would be no rational approval of his death. It is also here that we see that the death need not be intended by the person. Second, the person must put the situation into some form of context he understands. In this case, it is saying that if he throws his body on the grenade, then his death will save the lives of the members of his unit. Finally, there is a weighing of the evidence, although very brief, for the two alternative actions. If the Foxhole Jumper does not make his leap, then members of his unit will die and he might or might not die or be injured. If he makes the leap, then he will die but the members of his unit are spared. From these two alternatives, he chooses the latter, which implies that he accepts that particular action with its foreseeable and intended consequences over its competitor.

Cholbi seems to feel that he needs the rational endorsement condition in order to account for the intentionally part of his definition of suicide. By rejecting the position that a death has to be intended for it to be a suicide, Cholbi has to find a similar enough internal mechanism to link the agent to her death so that the action is a suicide. That is where intentionally comes into play. "Everything a person intends, or that is part of her intention, whether her end or means, is thereby intentional. But not everything intentional is thereby a component of a person's intention" (p. 27). Foxhole Jumper does not intend his death; so it cannot be a suicide on those grounds. Since Cholbi still wants to call what Foxhole Jumper does a suicide, the death has to be intentional but unintended. Hence, the claim that Foxhole Jumper rationally endorses his own death appears to be necessary to do the work Cholbi wants it to do.

Although Cholbi builds a strong case, I have to admit to being a bit leery about the level of rationality and commitment Foxhole Jumper has in his case. We can stipulate the certain mental states that run through Foxhole Jumper's head before he makes the decision to act, but in the real world, can such a thing happen? Given that most grenades detonate in 5 seconds -- and from that meager handful of seconds we must deduct the time the grenade spent getting to the floor of the foxhole in the first place -- there is not a great deal of time to do the necessary foreseeing, evaluating, and endorsing required for a rational endorsement.

However, we still want to say that Foxhole Jumper acted as a moral or rational agent in the situation, especially if we want to think that he acted in a way that was supererogatory. If he did not act, but merely exhibited behavior the way that a trained dog would, then we cannot say that his action was right, wrong, permissible, obligatory, or supererogatory. His action definitely would not be heroic if it was merely a reflex born from an uncontrollable impulse on Foxhole Jumper's part.

So how do we have the behavior rise to the level of an action while still accounting for the very limited time and other constraints which could very well make it impossible for there to be a rational endorsement? My suggestion is that we broaden what counts as "intentionally" to include not only rational endorsement but non-rational acquiescence as well. Non-rational acquiescence can do the same heavy lifting as rational endorsement does in regard to classifying actions as suicides, while not running into the same difficulties.

First, rational endorsement is too high of a standard in the Foxhole Jumper case on the grounds of the rational component. In many situations, there is no real time and insufficient information to make a rational endorsement. By a rational endorsement I am assuming that the evidence on the whole sufficiently supports the endorsement over its competitors. An endorsement is irrational if the evidence on the whole sufficiently shows that the endorsement is defeated by a competing endorsement with far superior evidence. Perhaps there is an endorsement that is better supported given the actual situation. Finally, a non-rational endorsement is the result of there being insufficient evidence for or against an endorsement. In this particular case, it is the agent's desires that provide primary motivation to make the endorsement or not rather than the endorsement being based solely on the evidence. Non-rational endorsements happen in cases in which the evidence is too evenly matched or there is insufficient evidence to conclude one's endorsement is supported over the others relevant in the situation. What drives these types of endorsement is primarily desire- or emotion-based, such as being based on care for oneself or others.

A much stronger case can be made that Foxhole Jumper's endorsement is non-rational. Given that Foxhole Jumper is a rational person who uses appropriate means to achieve his goals, then his behavior is an action. We can say that the action is rational in that manner. However, the lack of time and information for reason to do its job of weighing evidence makes it unlikely that Foxhole Jumper is sufficiently influenced by reason to make a rational endorsement. At best, his endorsement is non-rational because he desires to save his unit members' lives. He cares for them; therefore he wants to save them even though it will cost him his life. Foxhole Jumper's reasoning makes the action rational, but the reason he does it is primarily because of care or some similar motivation.

Second, and more importantly, it is hard to see that Foxhole Jumper endorses his own death. An endorsement shows some form of positive feeling toward whatever is being endorsed as well as approval, as we can see in political and product endorsements. The person doing the endorsing likes whatever is being endorsed and is trying to cause others to feel the same as she does. Endorsing, therefore, is a very active and positive thing to do. If Foxhole Jumper endorses his death, then he is not merely accepting the inevitable. However, if Foxhole Jumper had a chance to tell us what he feels about his death, then it is unlikely that he would give it such positive approval. Although he would approve of it in some way because he has chosen to do it, it does not seem as if he would be endorsing his own death.

Acquiescence, on the other hand, merely shows that the person accepts what happens to him but does not think positively of it. When we get vaccinated against the flu, for example, we do not rationally endorse the pain from the inoculation but we do acquiesce to it so that we can get the benefit of not being laid up for a week feeling like death warmed over. We accept the pain for the benefit we reap.

The same holds true for Foxhole Jumper. He foresees that his death is a means to the end of saving the others, and he acquiesces to it, but he would never endorse his death because that would not recognize his true value. If he felt positively toward his death the way an endorsement requires, then we lose some of the worth of the actual sacrifice Foxhole Jumper has made. His death seems less serious than if it was done out of a true realization of what his action entails. By recognizing that he will die if he continues, and accepting through acquiescence that state of affairs with the gravity it deserves, then we get a more accurate picture of what is actually happening when one soldier performs such heroism. Hence, if we adopt non-rational acquiescence, then Foxhole Jumper's action is still a suicide according to Cholbi's definition, but one that recognizes what happens in these unusual circumstances.

That being said, Cholbi's book will prove a valuable tool to undergraduates and those seeking to understand the standard positions on suicide that continue to influence ethical discussions about the taking of one's own life and related ethical questions. It also proves to be of interest to those who are more steeped in the subject matter.