Summoning Knowledge in Plato's Republic

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Nicholas D. Smith, Summoning Knowledge in Plato's Republic, Oxford University Press, 2019, 205pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198842835.

Reviewed by Raphael Woolf, King's College London


Although not mentioned in the title, I think it is fair to say that the main focus of Nicholas D. Smith’s book is Plato’s use of images in the Republic, in terms both of that work’s theorizing about the role of images and its use of images as vehicles for theorizing. Smith is particularly interested in how images are used in the Republic as educational tools, and specifically, in their ability to ‘summon’ the souls of its readers (as, Smith argues, Socrates likewise employs images with his interlocutors) away from the perceptible world towards an apprehension of the intelligible. Given that, as Smith emphasizes, Plato seems to recognize that images can be used in this way — here Smith focusses especially on the lower subdivision of the upper section of the Line, where perceptible images function as aids to grasping intelligible reality — it is not a big leap to suggest that Plato intends the Republic itself, teeming with images as it is, to be used in that way.

The ‘summoning’ role of images is seen by Smith as contrasting with a view of education that regards the latter as mainly concerned with the transmission of information to the soul of the learner. Here Smith calls upon the famous passage at Republic VII 518b-d in which Socrates denies that education consists in putting knowledge into souls as if putting sight into blind eyes. Rather, this ‘power’ (dunamis, 518c5) to know is already in each person’s soul and education is the art of ‘turning around’ the soul in possession of this power from darkness to light, from becoming to being.

Smith has a stimulating discussion of the argument in Republic V that distinguishes knowledge from belief, in which he takes with admirable seriousness, and follows through with tenacity and insight, the characterization there of knowledge as a power, to produce an illuminating account of that highly contested text and of how to understand the difference described therein between knowledge and belief in regard to their respective powers. (One might add that Smith’s discussion of the rather neglected ignorance as a power is also excellent.)

The power that is knowledge is not engaged, on Smith’s interpretation, only when one fully grasps the Forms. It is also in play just insofar as one is able to conceive the Forms as existing separately from their instantiations rather than taking (as the lovers of sights and sounds do) there to be no more to (say) beauty or justice than their instantiations in the perceptible realm. Thus, to return to the lower part of the intelligible section of the Line, when mathematicians use perceptible images to get at the Square itself or the Diagonal itself, they are engaging their power of knowledge even without achieving the full grasp of the intelligible engendered by the use of dialectic.

So too, in Smith’s view, when Socrates produces an image of the Form of the Good, via the Sun analogy, we are not to regard this as a mere expression of opinion, but as an exercise of Socrates’ power of knowledge such that he (and Glaucon as well) are ‘thinking about the good’ (87, Smith’s emphasis), albeit without having brought the power ‘into its fullest realization’ (ibid.). Hence in turn Plato intends ‘to put us in the same condition: one of thinking about reality . . . though not (yet?) in a way that will allow us to use that power in its most fully developed way’ (ibid., Smith’s emphasis). Thus for all their necessary flaws (they are images after all) images play a powerful educational role in the economy of the Republic.

In outline this thesis about the role of images is an appealing one. Indeed it comports with a view on Smith’s part of Plato’s general outlook in the Republic with which I find myself in considerable sympathy: the work is constructed neither as a jocular reductio of its own positions nor as a dogmatic assertion of those positions but as ‘provocative . . . intended to stimulate thought — to raise questions much more than to settle any of them’ (19, Smith’s emphasis). However, when we look more closely at how Smith sets about establishing his thesis, some problems do appear.

To explore these a little I return to 518b-d, which evidently serves as a canonical text for Smith since it bookends his reading, appearing early in the Introduction (2) and again in the Closing Remarks (181-2). One can certainly see how this text might serve the overall thesis: if the putting of knowledge into souls that lack it is not the right description of how education works, then we have motivation for the idea of education as (say) stimulus of the soul by the use of images instead. What is more, the text seems to license Smith’s insistence that, however the Republic conceives positively of the role of knowledge in relation to education, it is not regarded as propositional. For ‘that sort of knowledge is something we can lack and then acquire’ (5), whereas, according to Smith, 518b-d dismisses an idea of education whereby our souls come to have something that they previously lacked. Thus Smith states that Plato has Socrates ‘make very plain that education, at least as he is discussing it in the Republic, is not about putting into people what is not already there’ (3).

This picture seems unfortunately to rest on a misconstrual of 518b-d. The text does undoubtedly characterize knowledge as a power that it is not the job of education to instill in souls that lack it. But Smith himself draws a distinction in the course of his discussion between knowledge (as a power) and what is known, and in so doing maintains that ‘In the case of “propositional knowledge,” what is known is some information about the world, perhaps encoded in some proposition’ (5). Given this distinction, Socrates’ denial that education is putting the power of knowledge into souls looks compatible with the view that it may consist in putting other things — say, propositions — into souls.

That there might be a limited place for transmission of propositions is in fact something that Smith countenances. He writes (5): ‘Propositional knowledge may certainly be gained along the way in Plato’s model of education; but it seems unlikely that such knowledge will be the focus of an education that is not aimed at the acquisition of what the student does not already have’. This way of putting things, however, seems question-begging. Socrates has not said that education does not aim at the soul acquiring what it does not already have; he has said that education does not consist in putting a power into the soul that it does not already have. That task Socrates seems to regard, given his analogy, as no more feasible than putting the power of sight into eyes that lack it. But nothing Socrates has said thus far rules out that the focus, not merely the periphery, of education might be the putting into the soul of something other than a power (for example, propositions).

Socrates does of course also say positively here what he thinks education is. It is the art of turning the soul around in the right direction, from becoming to being and ultimately to the ‘brightest object’ (518c9), the Form of the Good. How does this ‘turning around’ relate to the transmission of propositions? Not surprisingly, Smith denies that Forms, as the paradigm cases of being, are the sorts of things that encode propositional information. He says that for Plato ‘what is known are the forms’ (5, Smith’s emphasis) and that ‘Unless forms are propositions, or consist in propositionalizable information’ then Plato cannot mean that knowledge is a relation to propositions (ibid.). Smith then gives, as his grounds for Forms not being of this sort, that they ‘are abstract objects that are not linguistic in the appropriate way. Forms give the names of predicates . . . and thus are not true or false in the way of propositions’ (6, Smith’s emphasis).

I confess that I do not see how what follows Smith’s ‘and thus’ has been entailed by what precedes it. Neither is it clear what is meant by ‘in the appropriate way’. If it just means ‘by consisting in propositionalizable information’ then we are going round in a very small circle. We need a reason to suppose that abstract objects, as characterised within the Republic‘s theory, do not consist in this sort of information and we have not, I think, been offered one. The idea that Forms give the names of predicates does not, at any rate, seem to rule out that they consist in such information. The Form of Justice, let us assume, gives the predicate-name ’just’: why does this have any tendency to show that the Form does not consist in propositionalizable information?

Even if it has not been shown that Forms fail to be propositionally encoded, the question is still open as to whether or not the turning around of the soul that Socrates says constitutes the art of education consists in the transmission of propositional information. Here it is noteworthy that when Smith returns to consider 518b-d at the end of the book, his emphasis on the place of information transmission seems rather different than it was at the beginning. Smith has by now considered in more detail the higher education in mathematical subjects that Socrates lays down for the trainee philosopher-ruler. As a result of this consideration, instead of speaking about information being acquired ‘along the way’ (Smith had also earlier spoken of such acquisitions as ‘by-products’ (3)), Smith now says: ‘The mathematical education . . . would certainly give the young future rulers plenty of new information . . . Plato should obviously not be taken to be denying that his students will be learning new things in this sense’ (182).

So does at least the mathematical education turn out to consist in the transmission of information? Smith thinks not, since he adds: ‘Even so, it is not the acquisition of these new things that Plato regards as the primary goal of the education he presents in Book VII’ (182). That goal remains ‘that those undergoing education are provoked into summoning their powers of knowledge, and to use this power [sic] . . . in a way that involves images’ (ibid.). Now it is not obvious to me why the summoning of one’s powers of knowledge should not consist in the acquisition of certain sorts of propositional information — unless one (wrongly) thinks that 518b-d has ruled out an acquisition model of education. But the talk of ‘summoning’ (present also in his title) does not of course come from nowhere. It is based on the passage at VII 523a-4d (which Smith quotes from extensively at 160 and 162-3), in which Socrates uses the example of fingers to illustrate how the puzzling reports of perception, to the effect that the same thing has opposite properties, provoke the soul into using reason to investigate these properties further.

It seems clear that these reports that perception delivers are not simply to be accepted at face value by the soul of the perceiver: they cause puzzlement and in so doing provoke reason to interrogate them. Yet even here the summoning seems to take place via the transmission of propositional information, albeit information that the soul is meant to question. Perception ‘reports (parangellei) to the soul that the same thing is hard and soft when it perceives it’ (524a2-3) and ‘says (legei) that the same thing is also soft [as well as hard]’ (524a7).

If even here, when Socrates explicitly focusses on a role for provocation in the education of the soul, the transmission of propositional information is crucial, there seems little reason to debar it from a central role in the subsequent stages of education. It is at any rate evident that provocation by perception is but a preliminary step. We go on, if we are philosopher-rulers in training, to study the mathematical subjects, where Smith himself admits that we will learn plenty of new things. But now there no longer appears to be a motivation to see these studies as needing to consist in anything other than the reception of propositional information. In line with Socrates’ stated view of education, the goal of the studies is to redirect our soul away from the perceptible realm towards the Good. The studies do this by drawing our soul upward over at least part of the intelligible terrain. That being the case, I am not sure what grounds remain for thinking that our growing acquaintance with that terrain could not perfectly well consist, on Socrates’ own picture, in the learning of new information.

I have dwelt, perhaps disproportionately, on Smith’s reading of 518b-d and its corollaries. The reason I have done so is that it seems to me important, in assessing the book, to distinguish between the weaker thesis that provocation through images is an element of education as the Republic conceives it; and the stronger thesis (which seems to be the thesis of the book) that this is the main way in which the Republic conceives of education. The weaker thesis seems to me hard to deny, and Smith’s exploration of the role of images in the Republic does sterling work in corroborating it. The stronger thesis, while an attractive one, is not one that I think the book succeeds in establishing; and that, in a nutshell, is because 518b-d does not give the thesis the backing that Smith thinks it does. Despite this, the book remains overall a rich and stimulating resource for any reader interested in investigating the relation between knowledge and education in the Republic.