Supersizing the Mind: Embodiment, Action, and Cognitive Extension

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Andy Clark, Supersizing the Mind: Embodiment, Action, and Cognitive Extension, Oxford University Press, 2008, 286pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195333213.

Reviewed by Lawrence Shapiro, University of Wisconsin-Madison and Shannon Spaulding, University of Wisconsin-Madison


Andy Clark's Supersizing the Mind begins as a manifesto in which the components of an embodied theory of mind are carefully moved into place, proceeds to a defense of these components from recent critical attacks, and ends with words of caution to those who would seek to extract too much from the embodied perspective. Readers unfamiliar with Clark's earlier works are likely to find the result dazzling -- an exciting, novel, and coherent conception of the mind that dares one to abandon nearly every vestige of a comfortably Cartesian view of mind. Of course, philosophers of mind have, for the most part, already jettisoned the idea that minds are an ethereal sort of non-physical substance. We can now assert with no great temerity that Descartes was wrong about that. Even so, one might still agree with Descartes that minds are in some sense distinct from bodies. They are, as it were, in the head. Yet, if Clark's case for embodiment is on track, minds are not in the head. The supervenience base for a mind (and not simply mental content) can include pieces of the extracranial body and, indeed, objects in the world beyond.

Part One of the book, "From Embodiment to Cognitive Extension," lays out the manifesto. Those who have read Clark's earlier Being There (1997) or have kept abreast of his more recent articles will find some of this material familiar. There's the idea from Rodney Brooks' pioneering exploration of mobile robots, as well as Dana Ballard's theory of deictic pointers, that agents can use the world as its own best model, rather than having to go to the expense of constructing detailed internal representations. "Bodily actions," Clark tells us, "here appear as among the means by which certain … computational and representational operations are implemented. The difference is just that operations are realized not in the neural system alone but in the whole embodied system located in the world" (p. 14). There is also the idea of scaffolding. Cognitive agents alter their environments in an effort to enhance their cognitive capacities. These augmented cognitive capacities in turn suggest further modifications of the environment, generating still greater cognitive abilities, leading to even further environmental modifications, and so on. "The cumulative complexity here is genuinely quite staggering. We do not just self-engineer better worlds to think in. We self-engineer ourselves to think and perform better in the worlds we find ourselves in" (p. 59). And there is fascinating new material, such as a discussion of a monkey trained to move a distant robot arm with just its thoughts. After training, the monkey's cortical representation of its body has expanded to incorporate the arm's extent. On Clark's view, this happening suffices to show that the monkey is a profoundly embodied creature: it is "highly engineered to be able to learn to make maximal problem-simplifying use of an open-ended variety of internal, bodily, or external sources of order" (p. 42).

Of course, many will see the evidence Clark assembles for embodiment to be easily, and perhaps more naturally, interpretable in other ways. For instance, why not retain the traditional view that minds are "in the head" and explain Ballard's work with deictic pointers as showing that minds are skilled at using the environment in place of detailed internal representations? Why take the further step of insisting that pieces of the world to which the subject saccades become literally parts of the visual process? Use of a hammer, after all, does not entail that the hammer becomes literally part of the arm. Similarly, so what if the monkey's cortical representation of its body comes to incorporate the robotic arm? How does this possibly imply that the mind extends beyond the brain?

Clark is aware of these complaints, saying of cases like the monkey's that they reveal the mind (at least in the case of primates) as "forever testing and exploring the possibilities for incorporating new resources and structures deep into their embodied acting and problem-solving regimes … On this account, the body is both critically important and constantly negotiable" (p. 42). But this response does little to ease the skeptic's frustration. To be sure, the skeptic might press, the body is critically important for cognition. And it is interesting, the skeptic might continue, that the mind can adjust to variation in the body's morphology. But there's still a mind, and still a body, and little reason to think that the boundaries between the two are partial, porous, or pliable.

Part Two of Supersizing the Mind, "Boundary Disputes," mounts a more thorough and convincing defense of the ideas that Part One has introduced. Adams and Aizawa (2008) in particular, but Rupert (2004) as well, have challenged Clark on a number of fronts. A persistent criticism involves Clark and Chalmers' claims for Otto, a victim of a disease that causes forgetfulness, who resorts to a notebook to remember facts such as the location of a museum (conveniently, Clark includes the article from which the example is drawn, "The Extended Mind," in an appendix). On Clark and Chalmers' view, if Otto's relation to the information in the notebook is similar enough to an ordinary person's (they call her Inga) relation to dispositional beliefs, then the notebook entries are, literally, among Otto's dispositional beliefs. Parts of Otto's mind thus exist outside his brain.

In response, critics of extended cognition have argued that the cognitive routines involving biological memory and those involving external stores of information are importantly different. Adams and Aizawa and Rupert point to phenomena like the primacy effect and negative transfer as features distinctive of the cognitive routines of biological memory and point out that these effects would not exist for notebook entries. This shows that Otto's relation to the notebook entries is not, after all, similar to a normal person's relation to dispositional beliefs. But, Clark rejoins,

[the] claim was not that the processes in Otto and Inga are identical, or even similar, in terms of their detailed implementation. It is simply that, with respect to the role that the long-term encodings play in guiding current response, both modes of storage can be seen as supporting dispositional beliefs. It is the way the information is poised to guide reasoning … and behavior that counts. (p. 96)

Two questions arise here: First, why is fine-grained similarity not required to show that Otto's dispositional beliefs exist in his notebook? Second, if we accept that what matters is merely coarse similarity between Otto and Inga, how much coarseness is permissible before having to give up the idea that the items in Otto's notebook really are beliefs?

With regard to the first question, Clark repeatedly claims that the argument for extended cognition was never meant to hinge on fine-grained similarity (pp. 88, 96-97, 99). Clark asks us to imagine creatures with memory processes quite distinct from those in a normal human being. Clark asserts that we would not deny that these creatures have dispositional beliefs merely because their cognitive processes are unlike our own. Thus, detailed similarity is not a necessary condition for being a cognitive process, and Adams and Aizawa, as well as Rupert, have been throwing punches at a straw man.

There is, however, a lacuna here. Clark argues against the claim that fine-grained similarity is a necessary condition for regarding an extended process as cognitive, but the critic may still respond that sameness of coarse-grained similarity is insufficient. But suppose we accept the sufficiency claim. This takes us to the second question: if we accept that what matters is only a rough parity between Otto's and Inga's cognitive processes, is Clark right that even this rough parity exists? This is not so clear. There are important differences between Otto and Inga, e.g., Otto's "remembering" involves perception -- reading the entries in his notebook -- whereas Inga's memory does not. Also, according to the standard folk psychological conception of dispositional beliefs, dispositional beliefs can affect our behavior without ever becoming occurrent, but this seems impossible for the entries in Otto's notebook. Moreover, our beliefs are updated automatically and this updating immediately results in the updating of a host of other beliefs, but this is not the case for Otto and his notebook. Finally, as Gertler (2007) has argued, if, as arguably the folk do, we conceive of introspection as necessarily first-person only, then the public accessibility of Otto's beliefs suggests that they cannot be introspected.

Clark may well wave aside all these differences between Otto and Inga's dispositional beliefs. "Just more details -- nothing significant," he might say. But now push comes to shove, for as the differences mount, the task of defending the claim that the entries in Otto's notebook are genuine beliefs becomes much more arduous. On the other hand, maybe whether the notebook entries are genuine beliefs or mere ersatz beliefs should not matter too much. What really matters to Clark is establishing that minds extend. Perhaps rather than biting so many bullets Clark should pursue a different sort of strategy: characterize more generally the conditions for something to count as mental and then show that Otto's notebook entries qualify. Clark, however, has been loath to say anything precise about why particular states should count as mental states, rebuffing on many occasions Adams and Aizawa's insistence that he must do so before passing judgment on the Otto case.

Part Three, "The Limits of Embodiment," finds Clark reining in the ambitions of some who, he believes, have pushed the embodied perspective beyond its proper scope, or have misunderstood some of its consequences. Alva Noë, for instance, goes wrong in attributing too much dependence of perceptual experience on features of the body. In a number of important papers with his collaborator J. Kevin O'Regan, as well as in his Action in Perception (2004), Noë has promoted the idea that perception is a function of (implicit) knowledge of sensorimotor contingencies (or dependencies). The world appears as it does, Noë argues, in virtue of an organism's knowledge of how its particular sensory organs are affected by the world, and how the stimulation affecting its sensory organs changes as a result of its actions on the world -- simple actions such as movement through the world or more complicated ones involving manipulations of objects in the world. This knowledge of sensorimotor contingencies, Noë argues, both determines the contents of perception and suffices to distinguish the various modes of perception.

Clark, despite his sympathies for Noë's general approach to perception, nevertheless thinks Noë goes too far in claiming that any difference in sensorimotor capacities would entail a difference in perceptual content. Noë, on Clark's view, is guilty of sensorimotor chauvinism, where such a chauvinist "holds, without compelling reason, that absolute sameness of perceptual experience requires absolute sameness of fine-grained sensorimotor profile" (p. 177). Why not suppose, Clark reasonably asks, that some perceptual experience is insensitive to differences in sensorimotor contingencies, allowing the possibility that organisms with different perceptual systems, or different modes of interacting with the world, may nevertheless have quite similar perceptual experiences?

Clark criticizes Shapiro for drawing from the embodied cognition literature a conclusion similar to Noë's. In The Mind Incarnate (2004), Shapiro argued that embodied cognition presents a challenge to the standard functionalist conception of mind, according to which minds are body-neutral, meaning that it should be possible to characterize the properties of a mind independently of the body and brain that realizes it. Rather, Shapiro observed, research in embodied cognition suggests that bodies matter in ways that functionalists tend to deny, to the extent that organisms with gross morphological differences would similarly display mental differences. However, Clark counters, one might imagine very different sorts of bodies with different sorts of sensory organs that, as a result of compensatory activities, end up producing identical perceptual experiences. What matters to the organisms' mental properties is that each organism "implements the same extended computational process" (p. 203), and this is possible even despite quite significant diversity in bodily form.

A curious feature of Clark's response to Shapiro is its apparent endorsement of precisely the sort of body-neutrality that Shapiro thought was adverse to the embodied perspective. If all that matters to minds are computational processes, or if minds just are particular sorts of computational processes, one must begin to wonder about the novelty of embodied cognition. Functionalists, as will be known by those who remember Ned Block's example of a nation that realizes a mind, would have no difficulty accepting the possibility that minds extend beyond heads. Is Clark simply recounting in greater detail how this might be true?

Critical as this review has been, we hope as well to have conveyed the excitement of the ideas that Clark has done us the great favor of developing. Supersizing the Mind is tantalizing in many respects, and Clark's ingenuity is always on display. Just as his earlier Being There launched many a research project, we expect that Supersizing the Mind will inspire a new generation of philosophers, psychologists, and artificial intelligence researchers to reconsider some basic assumptions about the mind. This is always the way of progress.


Adams, F. and K. Aizawa (2008), The Bounds of Cognition, Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.

Clark, A. (1997), Being There: Putting Brain, Body and World Together Again, Cambridge, MA: MIT press.

Gertler, B. (2007), "Overextending the Mind?" in Arguing About the Mind, eds. B. Gertler and L. Shapiro, New York: Routledge, pp. 192-206.

Noë, A. (2004), Action in Perception, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Rupert, R. (2004), "Challenges to the Hypothesis of Extended Cognition," Journal of Philosophy, 101, 8, 389-428.

Shapiro, L. (2004), The Mind Incarnate, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.