Suppose and Tell: The Semantics and Heuristics of Conditionals

Suppose And Tell The Semantics And Heuristics Of Conditionals

Timothy Williamson, Suppose and Tell: The Semantics and Heuristics of Conditionals, Oxford University Press, 2020, 288pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198860662.

Reviewed by Malte Willer, University of Chicago


According to the material analysis of conditionals, the meaning of ‘if,’ understood as the contribution this expression makes to the truth-conditions of sentences in which it occurs, is captured by the material conditional; linguistic constructions of the form ‘if A, then C’ are true just in case A is false or C is true. The analysis is notorious for its empirical shortcomings; despite some prominent attempts to defend its viability by H. Paul Grice (1989) and Frank Jackson (1979, 1987), the overwhelming consensus among philosophers and linguists is that we better look elsewhere for a story of what it takes for a conditional to be true. Timothy Williamson’s book is another attempt to demonstrate that the consensus is mistaken. Its first half argues that a material analysis of indicative conditionals (such as ‘If Mary came to the party, it was fun’) actually makes best sense of how competent speakers assess such constructions; the second half extends the analysis to subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals (such as ‘If Mary had come to the party, it would have been fun’), arguing on compositional grounds that these are strict material conditionals over a contextually determined set of possible worlds.[1]

Williamson’s discussion starts in familiar territory by suggesting that conditionals are evaluated by assessing their consequent under the assumption of the antecedent:

Suppositional Rule      Take an attitude unconditionally to ‘If A, C’ just in case you take it conditionally to C on the supposition A. (19)

This is essentially Frank Ramsey’s (1931) proposal for how to evaluate conditionals: accept a conditional if you hypothetically accept its consequent under the supposition of the antecedent. In endorsing it, Williamson follows a long tradition in the literature, though with a twist: for him, the Suppositional Rule is only a heuristic (a term Williamson introduces with a nod to the psychology literature) that tends to give the right answer under normal circumstances but may lead us astray in unfavorable cases. Cases of the latter kind, it turns out, abound in Williamson’s picture.

Traditionally, the goal has been to develop a semantics for conditionals that does justice to the Suppositional Rule (see, e.g., Stalnaker 1968). In Chapter 3, Williamson argues that such ambitions face an important limitation: the Suppositional Rule leads to paradoxical conclusions, at least given minimal assumptions.[2] As such, no (classical) semantics can fully validate this heuristic for the use of conditionals. Nonetheless Williamson suggests one can still hope for a semantics to validate the Suppositional Rule as far as possible (62). It is at this point that one may think that the case is lost for the material conditional analysis, since it is well known that it fails to predict, and is at times plainly inconsistent with, our ordinary practice of assessing conditionals. For instance, Williamson maintains, quite plausibly, that conditionals commute in the consequent with negation, in the sense that ‘if A, not C’ is to be accepted just in case ‘not (if A, C)’ is to be accepted (46). Here the guiding intuition is that negated conditionals and conditional negations have the ring of equivalence:

  1. It is not the case that if Mary called heads, she won.
  2. If Mary called heads, she didn’t win.

On the material conditional analysis, however, (1) and (2) are not at all equivalent: the wide scope negation in (1) entails that Mary called heads, while it is compatible with (2) that she did not. Accordingly, treating ‘if’ as the material conditional makes it quite puzzling why conditionals should interact with negation in the way Williamson suggests.

To give another example: according to Williamson’s Suppositional Rule for credences (32), one’s credence in a conditional ‘if A, C’ is one’s credence in C suppositional on A (assuming that one’s credence in A is non-zero). That makes good sense; for instance, one’s confidence in (3) seems to depend on how likely one takes the detector to go off in the presence of treasure:

  1. If there is a treasure buried here, the detector will go off.

But the material conditional analysis does not deliver this result, since it predicts that one’s confidence in a conditional should be at least as high as one’s confidence in the falsity of the antecedent. The implausible consequence is that high confidence in there being no treasure to be found here in the first place is enough to lend high credence to (3), regardless of what one thinks about the reliability of the detector.

The natural reaction to all of this would be to look for an alternative to the material conditional analysis, one that better reflects our ordinary ways of assessing conditionals. Williamson, however, does not do that. Instead, he suggests that whenever the Suppositional Rule and the predictions of the material conditional analysis come apart, we have just been misled by the former. Williamson spends a considerable amount of effort to defend the material interpretation of conditionals against counterexamples. But he also admits that, even on reflection, competent speakers remain firmly in the grip of the Suppositional Rule (Chapter 6.4). The key resulting question then is why one should believe that the semantics of conditionals should be thus strongly divorced from how we assess these constructions.

Williamson’s argument proceeds in a few steps here. Chapter 5 introduces a secondary heuristic for accepting conditionals: do so on the basis of testimony, under the same conditions for trust that apply to testimony in non-conditional form. This secondary heuristic can at times conflict with our primary heuristic, in that we accept a conditional based on testimony even though our credence in the consequent given the antecedent is low. Williamson’s key example here (similar in structure to one discussed by McGee 2000) involves a lecture by an expert psychiatrist who reports that congenital lying co-occurs with an enlargement of some specific area of the brain. Based on the expert’s testimony, it seems natural to come to accept the following conditional:

  1. If she is a congenital liar, that area of her brain is enlarged.

But, so Williamson continues, under the assumption that the expert is a congenital liar, we have little reason to trust her testimony in the first place, and thus little reason to accept that some area of her brain is enlarged. So, as far as the primary heuristic is concerned, (4) should not be accepted, since the credence for its consequent given the antecedent is not high.

Chapter 6 then argues that the material analysis best explains the combination of primary and secondary heuristic, despite their structural tensions. Since it treats ‘if’ as introducing no context-sensitivity on its own, conditionals are freely communicable, as required by the secondary heuristic. Furthermore, the material conditional is the strongest content whose probability is guaranteed to meet or exceed the probability of the consequent given the antecedent, rendering the primary heuristic sound and as complete as is compatible with soundness.

This is obviously a very complex line of reasoning, too complex to be efficiently dismantled here. The fact remains that whatever explanatory role Williamson’s preferred material analysis can play, it is far removed from how everyday speakers use conditionals, even on reflection. One may say that Williamson’s conception of meaning is not what semanticists are after, at least insofar as semantics is understood to contribute to a comprehensive account of what it is to speak and understand a language (as envisioned by, e.g., Chomsky 1965, 1986). On this understanding, meanings (or “semantic values”) are supposed to account for a range of facts about ordinary speakers’ semantic competence, including the ability to draw inferences and to assess sentences for truth or falsity. They cannot play this role if, as in the case of Williamson’s analysis, the semantics leads to predictions about speakers’ behavior that are reliably at odds with the empirical facts.[3]

Williamson, for sure, has little love for contemporary semantic theory, at least when it comes to the study of conditionals, diagnosing a widespread tendency to overfit the data and worrying signs of a deteriorating research paradigm (Chapter 16). But it does not seem like Williamson’s project has greener pastures on offer: here the semantics does not fit the data at all; to say anything about complex conditionals, the Suppositional Rule must be gradually extended with separate, hand-tailored evaluation procedures that are not predicted by the underlying semantic theory (as done in, e.g., Chapter 3.4). Williamson advertises such a large gap between theory and observation as typical of developed sciences (116), and yet one cannot help but think that there must be room for a healthier middle ground between underfitting and overfitting the data in semantic theorizing.

In the second part of the book, Williamson extends his analysis to subjunctive conditionals. The reasonable starting suggestion is that ‘if’ should have the same meaning in indicative and subjunctive conditionals. The challenge then is to explain how these two types of conditionals can differ in truth-value, as highlighted by the classical minimal pair from Ernest W. Adams (1975):

  1. If Oswald didn’t shoot Kennedy, someone else did.
  2. If Oswald hadn’t shot Kennedy, someone else would have.

The indicative in (5) is true, while the subjunctive in (6) is arguably not. For Williamson, the difference in truth-conditions between indicatives and subjunctives stems from the presence of the modal operator would. Following standard protocol, Williamson suggests that would is a necessity operator; combined with the material analysis of ‘if,’ that makes subjunctive conditionals strict material conditionals over a contextually determined set of possible worlds.

Strict material analyses of conditionals have fewer empirical problems than their simple material cousins; still, they have faced their fair share of criticism. David Lewis (1973) famously complains that a strict material analysis licenses strengthening of the antecedent and thus cannot make sense of the felicity of so-called Sobel sequences:

  1. (a) If Alice had come to the party, it would have been fun. (b) But if Alice and Bert had come, it would not have been fun. (c) But if Charles had come too, it would have been fun . . .

Sequences of this kind, so the argument goes, are perfectly felicitous, but on a strict analysis they are inconsistent (assuming that the antecedents of the conditionals at play are possible).

Williamson’s response to Lewis draws on existing work in defense of a strict analysis of conditionals (von Fintel 2001, Gillies 2007), the basic suggestion being that Sobel sequences exploit subtle shifts in context to color anteceding strengthening unacceptable—if the context remains fixed, strengthening of the antecedent is beyond reproach. Why, then, does strengthening of the antecedent have the air of invalidity? Once again, the blame falls on our common heuristic for how to evaluate conditionals, here as applied to subjunctives: considering an ‘if’-claim under the scope of would invites us to include worlds at which the antecedent is true. For instance, in considering (7a), we may ignore the possibility of Alice and Bert coming to the party, but such possibilities are natural to include in considering (7b). Here, then, our heuristic for evaluating conditionals leads us astray as it induces shifts in context as we move through the sequence. Williamson employs similar ideas to explain away other apparently problematic inferences licensed by the strict analysis, for instance contraposition and transitivity.

From the perspective of the existing literature on conditionals, the second part of Williamson’s book appears less provocative than its first part. Strict analyses of counterfactuals are nowadays at least respectable contenders, if supplemented with a suitably sophisticated story about how context can shift as discourse and reasoning proceeds. Furthermore, while our primary heuristic for evaluating conditionals is (by Williamson’s own admission) stubbornly irreconcilable with the material analysis, the conflict with the strict material analysis seems less stark: once we control for context shifts, many on first sight unacceptable consequences of the strict analysis do indeed seem unproblematic.[4]

Indeed, after reading Williamson’s arguments in favor of a strict analysis of subjunctive conditionals, one wonders why we shouldn’t say that indicatives are strict material conditionals as well, albeit with a domain different from subjunctives. At a minimum, that would allow us to appeal to features of context to bring the truth-conditions of indicatives closer in line with our primary heuristic. Williamson briefly considers and dismisses the option of re-thinking his basic story of conditionals: his main concern here is that while ‘would’ supplies a locus for contextual variation, ‘if’ does not (180). That may be so, but also seems to assume that no modal is present in plain conditionals. Kratzer famously suggests is that ‘if’ is a restrictor; in a conditional such as ‘If the butler didn’t do, it must have been the gardener,’ we restrict the domain of the modal ‘must’ to those in which the butler is innocent. Importantly, the restricted modal may be implicit (see Kratzer 2012 and references therein). On this proposal, even a plain conditional such as ‘If the butler didn’t do, it was the gardener’ includes a modal—so a locus for contextual variation is present after all, albeit not overtly. Williamson does not discuss alternative analyses in much detail (though critical remarks are made as he goes along); while this has many advantages, it also means that certain salient options remain underexplored.

This book is advertised as offering a fresh interdisciplinary perspective on the topic of conditionals by highlighting the role of psychological heuristics for assessing conditionals. Whatever we can learn from this approach, it does not make the empirical inadequacy of the material analysis of conditionals, understood as a semantic thesis about the meaning of conditionals, any less disconcerting than it was before. It is not unreasonable to be concerned about overcomplicating one’s semantic theory in response to natural language data, but here it looks like one possible extreme is replaced by another. And yet this is a powerful book, rich with ideas and sophisticated arguments, many of which cannot be addressed here but all worth studying. Philosophers and linguists interested in conditionals are encouraged—unconditionally—to form their own opinion about the arguments that this book provides; it is a rewarding read.


Thanks to Chris Kennedy and to Ginger Schultheis for helpful comments and discussion.


Adams, Ernest W. 1975. The Logic of Conditionals. Dordrecht: Reidel.

Cariani, Fabrizio, and Simon Goldstein. 2020. ‘Conditional Heresies.’ Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 101(2): 251–282.

Chomsky, Noam. 1965. Aspects of the Theory of Syntax. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

—— . 1986. Knowledge of Language: Its Nature, Origin, and Use. Westport, CT: Praeger.

von Fintel, Kai. 2001. ‘Counterfactuals in a Dynamic Context.’ In Ken Hale: A Life in Language, ed. Michael Kenstowicz, 123–152. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Gillies, Anthony S. 2007. ‘Counterfactual Scorekeeping.’ Linguistics and Philosophy 30(3): 329–360.

Grice, H. Paul. 1989. ‘Indicative Conditionals.’ In Studies in the Way of Words, ed. H. Paul Grice, 58–85. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Jackson, Frank. 1979. ‘On Assertion and Indicative Conditionals.’ Philosophical Review 88(4): 565–589.

—— . 1987. Conditionals. Oxford: Blackwell.

Kratzer, Angelika. 2012. Modals and Conditionals. New York: Oxford University Press.

McGee, Vann. 2000. ‘To Tell the Truth about Conditionals.’ Analysis 60(1): 107–111.

Lewis, David K. 1973. Counterfactuals. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Ramsey, Frank P. 1931. The Foundations of Mathematics. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.

Stalnaker, Robert C. 1968. ‘A Theory of Conditionals.’ In Studies in Logical Theory, ed. Nicholas Rescher, 98–112. Oxford: Blackwell.

—— . 1975. ‘Indicative Conditionals.’ Philosophia 5(3): 269–86.


[1] Some notes on terminology: categorizing conditionals as “indicative” versus “subjunctive” (or “counterfactual” for that matter) is problematic but also deeply entrenched; following standard protocol here is harmless for current purposes. “Strict” material conditionals are material conditionals preceded by some necessity operator; given the standard possible worlds analysis of necessity, they are thus universal quantifiers over a set of possible worlds; the domain of quantification is commonly assumed to be fixed by context.

[2] Minimal, though anything but innocent: for instance, Cut-like rules like the one Williamson relies on in Chapter 3.2, and which license appeals to the transitivity of some consequence relation as in ‘if B is a consequence of A and C is a consequence of B, then C is a consequence of A,’ fail on certain conceptions of logical consequence that are prominent in the literature on conditionals. To wit, Robert Stalnaker’s (1975) notion of “reasonable inference” allows one to infer ‘if not A, C from ‘A or C’ and ‘A or C’ from ‘A’, but not ‘if not A, C’ from ‘A’ (see Cariani and Goldstein 2020 for discussion). In general, Williamson does not explore the prospects of using non-classical escape routes from the paradoxes presented in Chapter 3.

[3] Since Williamson labels our evaluation procedures for conditionals “heuristics,” one might have thought that he would draw on insights from psychology to offer some explanation for why ordinary speakers miss the fact that indicative conditionals are just plain material conditionals. But despite the interdisciplinary pitch, this book has almost nothing to say about the psychology of conditionals.

[4] See in particular the discussion of “Strawson validity” by Kai von Fintel (2001). Not all issues for the strict analysis, to be clear, are solved by appeals to context: that conditionals commute in the consequent with negation, for instance, remains a bit of a puzzler.