Surrounding Free Will: Philosophy, Psychology, Neuroscience

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Alfred R. Mele (ed.), Surrounding Free Will: Philosophy, Psychology, Neuroscience, Oxford University Press, 2015, 342pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199333950.

Reviewed by Neil Levy, Florey Institute of Neuroscience and Mental Health/Oxford Centre for Neuroethics


Over the past decade or so, there has been an increasing interest in scientific approaches and challenges to free will. Spurred initially by experiments that have been claimed to show that conscious will is epiphenomenal, and more latterly by work in social psychology that seemed to indicate that belief in free will is correlated with, and may even be causally involved in, pro-social behavior, there is now a rich body of work on cognitive science and free will. In 2010, in large part in order to encourage work in this vein and philosophical reflection on it, the John Templeton Foundation funded a four-year project on free will, directed by Alfred Mele (an obvious choice, since Mele is both an important contributor to the more traditional literature on free will and has a longstanding interest in the psychological findings). This volume is one of the major outputs of that project.  (Readers should be aware that this reviewer has received Templeton funding).

The result is a fascinating series of high-quality, interlinked papers. The majority -- though not all -- of the authors are either scientists or philosophers with a serious interest in cognitive science; four chapters have authors from both camps. Most of the major topics that have animated debates at the intersection of free will and cognitive science are covered: the interpretation of the readiness potential that precedes voluntary action; the question whether or not the folk are natural incompatibilists; the question whether threatening beliefs in free will causes anti-social behavior; and so on. In addition, new ground is broken here, and some high quality more traditional philosophy is done. Every chapter is worth commenting on; for reasons of space I will confine myself to discussing some of the ones that I find particularly interesting today (next week I might choose a different set).

Much of the discussion of the neuroscientific evidence has construed it as threatening the existence of free will. As Mele has himself argued, this interpretation of the data is unwarranted. Pleasingly, the volume contains high-quality work by scientists who contribute to a more deflationary interpretation of the experimental work. This is exemplified by the papers on the readiness potential, an index of activity in the motor cortex that precedes voluntary action. Benjamin Libet famously argued that the readiness potential precedes the conscious intention (or urge) to move, a finding that has widely been taken to be threatening to free will. In their fascinating overview of developments in the literature since Libet, Uri Maoz and colleagues give us plenty of reason to think the concern is overblown. Neurally, decision-making seems to be a continuous process, not a dated event; representations of alternatives continue to be actively maintained even after action initiation begins. When subjects report an intention to move, moreover, they may actually be estimating a time by computing backwards from actual movement onset. Given these facts, there is no reason to think that the reported time reflects a significant event in decision-making. Similarly deflating are the experiments reported by Prescott Alexander and colleagues. They found that the readiness potential does not necessarily lead to movement and does not always precede movement, suggesting that it is not the correlate of an unconscious intention to move (though the lateralized readiness potential, which occurs slightly later, remains a candidate for such an intention).

For some readers, these papers may be disappointing inasmuch as they suggest that the neuroscience is not as relevant to the free will debate as they had thought. While that might be the right conclusion, it doesn't detract from the philosophical value of the work. Even if it doesn't illuminate the free will debate -- directly, at any rate -- it can aid us in understanding agency more generally. Adina Roskies tackles this question head on, asking to what extent monkey decision-making is a good model for human decision-making. She suggests that there are good -- though not completely decisive--reasons to think that the first is a good model of the second, and, even more interestingly, suggests that nothing in the model is incompatible with folk notions of decision making.

In addition to work in neuroscience, the free will debate has been animated by psychological work apparently linking free will beliefs with behavior. Roy Baumeister, Cory Clark and Jamie Luguri advance some interesting hypotheses concerning this relationship. The effects of a belief in free will on willingness to punish or to forgive seems to depend on the person's relationship to the wrongdoer. The more distant the relationship, the more belief in free will encouraged punitiveness. The authors suggest that for relative strangers, free will is held to be a necessary condition of blameworthiness that leads to punishment that has the function of upholding the norms of the group, but the overriding aim with those close to us is not upholding norms but restoring the relationship: attributing free will to the person leads us to think that they can change and the relationship can be saved. One potential problem with this explanation is that it invokes a consequentialist rationale -- upholding group norms -- in the service of explaining intuitions about desert. While the explanation of a disposition may invoke functions that seem at odds with the content of the intuition, the authors owe us an explanation of why we don't have consequentialist intuitions about these cases, given that they are supposed to serve consequentialist ends. It bears noting that the reader may get the impression from this chapter that beliefs in free will are easily manipulated and behavioral effects generated; in their paper, Jonathan Schooler and collaborators caution that neither is the case.

Andrew Monroe and Bertram Malle probe folk intuitions about free will. They build on their own earlier work, asking college students to describe the conditions required for free will. The students almost never mentioned anything metaphysically demanding: absence of constraint and the ability to make a choice are most commonly cited. Monroe and Malle replicated these findings in a community sample. They then explored whether their subjects had an implicit conception of free will that is metaphysically more demanding, assessing agent's willingness to assert that free actions involve a break in the causal order or action being uncaused. They found no evidence to support the claim that their subjects had a metaphysically demanding conception of free will. Monroe and Malle used reaction times as a measure of implicit beliefs. While this is appropriate for implicit states that are actually represented, however, it is unable to detect the kind of implicit commitment that some libertarian philosophers attribute to the folk: not implicitly believing that free actions are uncaused, but being implicitly committed to believing that. Further, the dominant libertarian position holds neither that free actions are uncaused nor that they break the causal order, but instead that they are indeterministically caused.

Gunnar Björnsson also addresses the question whether the folk are incompatibilists, as it arises in experimental philosophy. Earlier work by Shaun Nichols and Joshua Knobe appeared to show that they are incompatibilists, but Eddy Nahmias has argued that participants take determinism to be a threat to freedom because they misunderstand determinism as entailing that the agent's psychological states and processes are bypassed. Björnsson argues, on the basis of his own data, for a different compatibilist-friendly explanation of the data. His evidence seems to show that the folk take determinism to entail that psychological states do not make an independent contribution to what happens. If Nahmias is right, then folk incompatibilism rests on a mistake. If Björnsson is right, then any mistake the folk make is subtle.

Many philosophers are skeptical that these kinds of debate have any real philosophical payoff. In their chapter, Myrto Mylopoulos and Hakwan Lau tackle the question whether work in cognitive science and experimental philosophy might contribute to philosophical debates. As they argue, much of the data adduced in these debates is questionable, and it is hard to see how some of it bears on the philosophical debates at all. However, the case for the philosophical relevance of the experimental philosophy seems to me to be stronger than they recognize. The strongest argument for the philosophical relevance of the experimental work is that 'free will' and related concepts are woven into everyday self-understanding and into our practices and institutions. The empirical work seems to indicate that even if the folk do not often advert to free will, they do think that there is some kind of control that is required for moral responsibility and, more controversially, that it is threatened by determinism. Mylopoulos and Lau respond that that fact does not entail that the concept of free will plays a role in folk thought; only that the concept of some kind of non-constrained action that is extensionally equivalent to 'free will' plays a role in folk thought. Insofar as experimental philosophy is relevant to the free will debate, however, it is need not be concerned with characterizing how (or whether) the folk think of that concept; that it actually plays the requisite roles in folk cognition is enough. Mylopoulos and Lau also worry that the concept may come from philosophy or theology before entering folk psychology, which would render the investigation circular. That seems off the mark: the investigation would be circular only if folk usage of the concept has continued to be governed by philosophical or theological discourse. If it has not been, then philosophical investigation is not philosophy investigating itself.

The volume finishes with three papers in a more traditional vein: Carolina Sartorio on time travel and free will, J. T. Ismael on whether selves are real, and Randolph Clarke on responsibility for negligent actions and omissions. These papers seem somewhat out of place in the volume, but they are of the highest quality; it would be a shame if they don't find the audience they deserve because philosophers with an interest in these topics overlook the volume. In fact, the diversity of chapters entails that very few people will find every paper here interesting. But a large number of philosophers (and psychologists, too) will find some of great value.