Sympathy in Perception

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Mark Eli Kalderon, Sympathy in Perception, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 230pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108419604.

Reviewed by Catherine Legg and Jack Reynolds, Deakin University


Mark Eli Kalderon's book boldly positions itself as a work in speculative metaphysics. Its point of departure is the familiar distinction between presentational and representational philosophies of perception. Kalderon notes that the latter has been more popular of late, as it is more amenable to "an account" explicating causal or counterfactual conditions on perception (p. x); but he wishes to rehabilitate the former, at least in part. One widely-perceived disadvantage of presentationalism has been the way that understanding perception merely as registering the presence of things might seem to leave us vulnerable to error about the nature of what is presented. Kalderon seeks to remedy this not by dealing at length with various disjunctivist positions concerning perception which may be friendly to his position, nor by spending much time criticising opposing views, but by explicating presentationalist perception through a series of tactile metaphors, thereby providing a radically new philosophical view. He claims that we do not just 'stand before' reality, we grasp it -- the metaphor survives tellingly in ordinary language -- and he thereby seeks to defend a form of realism which is robust, though he admits, "pre-modern". He draws on a remarkably rich variety of thinkers to defend this position, including pre-modern, modern, and various figures from both analytic and continental philosophy -- however, although there is plenty of solid scholarship here, the book is aimed at metaphysics more than the history of ideas.

The first chapter, "Grasping" presents an extended haptic phenomenology. Grasping an object with my hand requires a subtle, ever-adjusting contact between me and the object which, over time, discloses its heft and shape. Insofar as my hand is required to literally adjust to the object's shape in order to hold it, it is not too far-fetched to claim that the two share qualities: an instance of formal causation (p. 23). Kalderon suggests that it is helpful here to recall the so-called 'Secret Doctrine of Protagoras' in Plato's Theaetetus: that perception consists not in active or passive relations between mind and world, but a special kind of 'double-sided' interaction between the two. This viewpoint sweeps away some characteristic sceptical anxieties of modern philosophy, such as "the possibility of a demon eliminating the object of the perceiver's experience while leaving that experience just as it is" (p. 29). Kalderon does acknowledge, though, that other, compensating worries remain (for instance: "non-perceptual experiences that appear from within just like the corresponding perceptual experience"). Furthermore, if we are going to claim that an intelligent body 'grasps' another object by perceiving aspects of itself (that are constitutively shaped by that object) how is such a duality even possible?

Time is important to Kalderon's view, the general idea being that "sensory presentation is of such a nature that its objects may be disclosed over time" (p. 14). He mobilises this insight in interesting ways in regard to colour -- eschewing its analysis as a secondary quality but instead connecting colour perception to activity with duration, challenging philosophical pictures that remain attached to either a strictly causal model or one where any phenomenological datum is given all at once: a time-slice picture. This enables him to avoid standard debunking moves concerning colour's objectivity: it may reveal itself only from a certain vantage point in certain conditions. For Kalderon, perfect size or color constancy in perception would come at the cost of losing information about the object (p. 182). In general, objects are presented with a certain ambiguity in any instant, and require time and action to clarify. Although given a more metaphysical rendering here, this idea appears related to views of perception wherein we seek optimal Gestalt, or "maximum grip" when we try to take in an artwork or another person (one can't stand too close in either case), all of which receive significant treatment in the phenomenological tradition, especially in Merleau-Ponty, whom Kalderon draws on in later chapters.

The second chapter, "Sympathy", addresses skeptical worries by describing a "principle of sympathy" which, it is posited, governs all genuine perceptions. This is sympathy understood not as simple psychological "fellow-feeling", but a much deeper and more general idea of "feeling something in another thing and in conformity with it" (p. 42). (He also sometimes uses the language of "communion" here.) This is the key idea around which much of the book turns, and here we move from Plato to Plotinus. Kalderon acknowledges what is likely to be many readers' worries about a deep-dive into 3rd century AD thinking by urging that it is possible to "simply drop Plotinus' vitalist metaphysics" (p. 80). (Readers will need to judge this for themselves.) The chapter's powerful conclusion is that perception is not an impression or an affection, but an activity -- this claim will become a key justification of perception's objectivity in the final chapter.

Although Kalderon's account is original, his view of perception as active is an insight also central to theorists of embodied and enactive cognition. They also sometimes make metaphysical moves related to those that Kalderon entertains, and give sustained attention to many key phenomena of interest to him: proprioception, haptic perception, and bodily awareness both reflective and pre-reflective. There are a couple of fleeting references to Alva Noë's work, where Kalderon recognises the connection (p. 84), and to Shaun Gallagher's How the Body Shapes the Mind (albeit via Fulkerson, p. 44), but this is under-explored and a promising line of further inquiry. For example, work in 4e cognition might contribute to Kalderon's argument concerning the importance and priority of haptic touch (exploratory, and over time), rather than Mike Martin's view where static touch has precedence (cf. p. 63). These theorists would also agree with some key claims in the book: e.g. "bodily awareness, however implicit, contributes to the variable haptic appearances in the exercise of a constant haptic perception" (p. 44). But this literature also brings some additional resources. Kalderon's book does not say much about pathology, and what the variability of human perceptual experience might mean. What if we have a diminished or non-existent proprioceptive sense, as with Ian Waterman (cf. Gallagher 2005), or "locked in" syndrome? Do such conditions complicate Kalderon's metaphysics? We couldn't see answers to these questions in the book.

This chapter also includes some interesting discussions of Maine de Biran and his touching-touched example that has subsequently had a major reception in the phenomenological tradition, being addressed by Husserl, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty and Derrida, amongst others. Kalderon, like Merleau-Ponty, wants to defend some of de Biran's insights here (against Sartre and Derrida's more aporetic treatments). On the metaphysical level, Kalderon's claim is that "the experience that the grasping hands gives rise to itself becomes like, if not exactly like, the tangible object presented in it, at least relative to the perceiver's haptic perspective" (p. 76). He considers some potential counterexamples to this thesis, but it is worth considering other sorts of perceptual experience where the work of communion and sympathy has more negative resonance. His definition of sympathy is broad enough to hold for situations like confronting an aggressor or enemy, on his telling (p. 81), but is it characteristic of desire, for example, or situations of traumatic perception, or racialized perception (cf. Ngo 2017)? What of the role of emotions in perception (cf. Morag 2017)? Some of these questions might be thought akin to asking why Kalderon didn't write a different book, but the basic point is that there is relatively little on other sorts of tactile experiences, many of which the phenomenological tradition is interested in, and accords a metaphysical dimension (e.g. Sartre on the caress, Levinas on 'voluptuosity').

Kalderon talks about haptic grasping as oriented to enclosure, and something of that model persists in his analyses of sound and vision. Maybe this is right, regarding basic kinds of perception, and the lived use of objects toward a given end: but what of intersubjectivity and our relation to other people? Is grasping and enclosure the basic telos, or formal condition of possibility of relatedness here? Many of Kalderon's examples are rather solipsistic: there is relatively little attention given to perceiving others, touching others (perhaps a handshake with another a la Merleau-Ponty), rather than my own right hand touching my left hand. Is there what Levinas called an "imperialism of the same" here, in which that which is different is "incorporated" in purported sympathy by the hand seeking enclosure? We don't wish to overstate this objection, which is perhaps anticipated by Kalderon when he recognises that his view might be thought to involve a "metaphysics of presence" (p. xv), but it is worth considering. Kalderon also talks about the assimilation of haptic experience to its object. This is formal rather than material, but the idea is that "the conscious qualitative character of the perceptual experience becomes something like, if not exactly like, the presented object without materially absorbing it" (p. 179). On certain views, however (Deleuze, for example), it might be argued that it is precisely the inability to assimilate which occasions thought. This raises the question: what does Kalderon think about thought and its relation to perception?

Claiming to have reaped rich rewards from turning philosophy of perception from its customary obsession with the visual to the tactile, in chapter 3 Kalderon considers whether studying our perception of sound might similarly produce new insight. Is there an auditory analogue of 'grasping'? Kalderon claims that there is: "in order to hear something we must listen" (p. 88). But in order to understand exactly what we are hearing, philosophical work must be done. Do we hear sounds and their sources? When I hear my cat miaowing, am I just hearing the miaow or am I hearing the cat? Berkeley famously chooses the former, Heidegger the latter. So the question arises: what are the bearers of audible qualities? Not bodies, Kalderon argues -- these are only sounds' "substrata" (p. 110). Rather, sounds and their sources are essentially dynamic entities that unfold through time (p. 103).

The sources of perceived sound are explored further in chapter 4 ("Sources"). Here a naturalistic grounding is constructed for the Heideggerian account. Theories of direct social perception have received increasing attention of late, whether indexed to a form of direct or naïve realism or not. They generally concern visual experience, however. Here, Kalderon offers a Heideggerian argument about sound in which we don't hear the sound, then infer the causes or sources; rather, we hear the sources directly. As Kalderon puts it, we often "hear a source through or in the sound it produces" (p. 127). He criticises models where discrete sounds have explanatory priority, and explains why his own view might be naturalistically plausible. Evolutionary biology accords a lot of attention, perhaps too much, to the basic motivations and drives it calls the 4Fs: fighting, feeding, fleeing, fornicating. It appears likely that attending to sources would have evolutionary priority for animal behaviour primarily oriented around these. Phenomenologically the view also appears plausible. In sonically complex environments, we arguably hear, say, a lawn mower outside our office, rather than hearing a neutral sound, then inferring to its cause. The key idea of sympathy does important work here again -- since sounds, as propagations of patterned disturbances, unfold over time, the mind must actively take them in. ("In hearing something we listen along with it", p. 141.)

Kalderon is now ready to let us consider vision anew. In chapter 5 ("Vision") he notes that in order to see well, one must look -- once again, an exercise in sympathy. Yet one might ask: what is the analogue in sight of the hand's grasping an object in touch, leading the hand to literally assume the object's qualities? The natural visual analogue would seem to be some kind of "extramission theory" -- the old idea that visual perception is brought about by "eyebeams" sent out of the eyes to strike objects. To say that this view is now widely discredited by science would be an understatement. It is a sign of Kalderon's philosophical assurance that he does not shy from this potential reductio, but gently probes the falsified theory for any partial truths it may embody. He concludes that, surprisingly, it does enshrine phenomenological insight. Without positing any sort of causal theory, he contends that perception "for us" is like a beam of light; the gaze is posed on objects and reaches them from a distance. Perception, rather than being passive, involves directing our attention at something in the world (something always given perspectivally) in rectilinear fashion, sustaining our visual attention against a background or horizon. Ordinary language, Kalderon suggests, captures something like this view when we speak of a "piercing glance", or a "cutting look". Metaphors, certainly, but on this view they express insights actively repressed by much of the modern tradition (p. xiii).

The overall aim here is to show a connection between perceptual objectivity and explanatory priority (p. 163). Kalderon appears to defend something like a manifest image or common sense realism about perceptual experience, rather than scientific realism, which sometimes succumbs to "grand illusion" views of the manifest image in the manner of Eddington's two tables. Indeed, in the final chapter, "Realism", Kalderon draws the epistemological morals that the overarching argument of the book has been leading up to, in a satisfying way. He notes that haptic perception has a long-standing role in "the rhetoric of objectivity" (a classic illustration being Dr. Johnson kicking the stone to 'refute' Berkeley). Touch seems clearly to be some kind of existential transaction. But Kalderon has also been at pains to establish that perceptual assimilation is formal, not material -- this means that what is conveyed is properties, not objects; in other words, the transaction is intelligible. A note of epistemic caution is introduced, though, regarding the perspectivalism of this position.

At this point Kalderon turns to Langton's defence of objective knowledge in Kant: although noumena cannot be known in their intrinsic properties, phenomena can be known through their relational properties, and thus a Kantian receptivity counts as epistemic humility. Kalderon rejects this solution, unsurprisingly, for the way it renders us unable to truly know reality. (A slightly odd note was struck by Kalderon's discussion of this material, lying as it does at the heart of "modern philosophy", in the context of most of the book's robust critique of that framework, e.g., for its epistemic passivity). Instead he turns to Bergson's faculty of intuition, which he argues has much more chance of delivering reality to the perceiver, through (once again) a principle of sympathy. In this model, the formal isomorphism between perceiver and perceived is most intriguing to consider for its (Neoplatonic) implication that when we genuinely perceive something we in some sense 'vibrate in synch' with it -- a claim with promising potential corollaries in, for instance, ethical and environmental philosophy. At this point, though, the reviewers did worry somewhat about Kalderon's confident claims that if only sufficiently sympathetic, we may be assured of 'grasping' a thing's inner nature. Is this part of the theory truly justified? How does it fit with previous admissions of perspectivalism? Doesn't grasping, by its very nature, rather deliver a kind of 'surface' of the enclosed object?

This book presents a carefully thought-through and well-integrated overall argument that is dazzling in its historical scope. Kalderon may be a philosopher who lives by the Rylean injunction that he would not be part of any 'ism' or philosophical group that might claim him. The reviewers found the corresponding broad-mindedness refreshing in these days of small and often rather 'sealed-in' philosophical communities and debates. On the downside, some passages are rather prolix, with a repetition of key points that sometimes reads as almost priestly (perhaps in homage to the days of the great philosophical schools). One might also worry about the anachronism of looking so determinedly to the Platonic and Neoplatonic eras, when there has now been so much philosophical water under the bridge. But the book does explicitly consider the objection that "There is no real possibility of rolling back philosophical thinking to the 5th century BC, just as there is no real possibility of living the life of a Bronze Age Chief, or a Medieval Samurai" (p. xi), and consciously addresses it in the introduction. The reply is that book aims at "concept-formation": a process not unknown in philosophy, particularly philosophy which seeks to revitalise debates that have become stale, and to 'grasp' reality in new and perceptive ways.


Gallagher, S. (2005). How the Body Shapes the Mind. Oxford University Press.

Morag, T. (2016). Emotion, Imagination and the Limits of Reason. Routledge.

Ngo. H. (2017). The Habits of Racism. Lexington.