System of Ethics

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Johann Gottlieb Fichte, System of Ethics, (tr. Günter Zöller and Daniel Breazeale), Cambridge University Press, 2005, 399pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521577675.

Reviewed by Christian Lotz, Michigan State University


During the last two decades, German Idealism has become more attractive and acceptable in the Anglophone world, especially given the slow breakdown of naturalism. Almost all important philosophy departments in the US have someone working in this area (though it is still not the case that the scholarly output is as high as it is on the Continent). Not only have important commentaries appeared on the main works of Hegel, but also, some of Schelling's works have been translated into English. Finally, even Fichte -- though often held to be the most obscure thinker within 18th and 19th century German thought -- celebrates his revival, especially due to the work of Daniel Breazeale and Tom Rockmore. Whereas Fichte's theoretical philosophy (in the form of his Science of Knowledge) has still not found much attention, his practical philosophy -- especially in its relation to Hegel -- has made its way into the heart of contemporary debates. For instance: Stephen Darwall has taken up Fichte's concept of intersubjectivity from a systematic point of view (see Darwall, Stephen, "Fichte and the Second-Person Standpoint," in Internationales Jahrbuch des Deutschen Idealismus, 3/2006, 91-113), Alan Wood takes Fichte to be the main important thinker within an Anti-Cartesian paradigm (see Wood, Alan, "Fichte's Intersubjective 'I,'" in Inquiry, 49/1, 62-79, 2006, 62-79), and even Axel Honneth, from the perspective of social philosophy and the Frankfurt School, has rediscovered Fichte's practical philosophy (see Honneth, Axel, "Die transcendentale Notwendigkeit von Intersubjektivitaet," in Honneth, Axel, Unsichtbarkeit. Stationen einer Theorie der Intersubjektivitaet, Frankurt: Suhrkamp 2003, 28-48).

More than 200 years after its original appearance, the first -- and for a long time to come -- authoritative translation of Fichte's main ethical work, System der Sittenlehre (1798), has been carried out by two eminent scholars of Fichtean philosophy, namely, Daniel Breazeale (University of Kentucky) and Günter Zöller (Universität München). The publication of this text is an "event," especially since it closes an important historical gap for the philosophical reconstruction of the historical field between Kant and Hegel and since, in addition, it will deepen the aforementioned contemporary debates.

In this specific work, Fichte is not concerned with the concepts of intersubjectivity and recognition, since for him morality remains solely as a problem of subjectivity and is thereby reconstructed within a metaphysics of the ego (though in his concrete doctrine of duties, sketched in the final part of the System, Fichte is very concerned with the social effects of morality, most especially with the specific duties of individuals who hold certain positions in societies, such as scholars, priests, and politicians).

The System of Ethics is divided into three main parts: [1] "The deduction of the principle of morality" deals with the transcendental reconstruction of the moral law and freedom as a necessary condition for the thinking 'I.' [2] "The deduction of the reality and applicability of the principle of morality" explains how the concept derived in [1] can have an effect in the world. [3] "The systematic application of the principle of morality, or ethics in the narrower sense," presents a system of duties derived from [1] and [2]. The first part is certainly the most important, due to Fichte's attempt to combine two important aspects that Kant, according to his successors, had left unsolved, namely, on the one hand, the unclear connection between the moral law and his theory of subjectivity, and on the other hand, the gap and division between theoretical and practical reason. Accordingly, Fichte tries to show that the moral law is the condition for being a self-conscious entity, and he tries to demonstrate that reason is a unity. As Fichte claims, thinking, or intelligence, is itself practical, and every intelligent entity has to construct itself as a thinking being under the moral law.

Ethics, as Fichte understands it from his transcendental philosophy, is the investigation of all necessary conditions for thinking (or constructing) ourselves as "effective" in this world, which refers to the investigation of how it is possible for rational subjects to factually take themselves to be agents. In this connection, he asks: what are the ideal conditions for the possibility of action, or, put in Fichte's popular language (as presented in The Vocation of Man), why do we (necessarily) believe that the world is not only our representation, but allows us to be effective in it? Why do we take our representations not simply as representations of the world? Why do agents (necessarily) have faith in their own capacity to go beyond the representational world? Even a simple move of our hands presupposes this faith, though within the natural attitude we usually take this belief for granted and forget about it. Consequently, Fichte wants us to consider "how we ever come to take some of our representations to be the ground of a being" (8). In contrast to The Vocation of Man, in this text Fichte presents a subtle and extremely complex response to this task. To start with, it is not only the case that reason is divided into a part that lets the world be as it is, and into a different practical part that creates or changes reality out of itself; rather, letting the world be in thought requires an understanding of that activity as a practically self-determined activity. In contrast to Hegel, though, who takes Fichte's basic position over in section 384 of his Encyclopedia (1830), transforming it into the larger claim of Geist and its own appearance as Geist in the world, Fichte tries to come up with a full system of thought that makes the transcendence of the representational world and theoretical reason itself intelligible. He does this by claiming that this transcendence is subject to an "ought," which means, despite his often misunderstood "idealism," that Fichte's position is much closer to a Kantian constructivism than it is to Hegel's logical and metaphysical theory of the whole.

Fichte starts out with the elaboration of some concepts that he had previously dealt with in his Science of Knowledge, such as "agility," "limitation," and the subject-object dichotomy, wherein he transforms the problematic of the self-limitation of the activity of the intellect into the question of how to clarify the "constrained state [Gebundenheit] both of the object and of ourselves as intelligence" (14). Here, he claims that the subject, as activity, must create a concept (intelligent object) that comes [1] from itself and at the same time [2] constrains the subject, which is to say, constrains itself. Accordingly, this concept cannot be found in the outer world; rather, it must be an end or absolute purpose, out of which the whole system of practical concepts can be analytically deduced. If this were not the case, we could not explain why the "agility" [Agilität] of the subject (as opposed to something that just is) could ever be determinate act, that is, how it could ever be a specific activity (this activity). "Were this not the case," as Fichte puts it, "then I would not be absolutely active and would not be immediately posited in this way" (15). Furthermore, the conceptual self-determination of the subject in its activity is ultimately the reason for Fichte's introduction of the appearing will as that according to which we find ourselves as rational agents, since the concept of an end can only be a concept for the subject if it is "willed." For, a pure representation never leads to the concept of an end. In addition, though I cannot reconstruct the argument in this review, as Fichte further claims in an eminently phenomenological sense, this will must have the form of the lived body, which is not conceived by Fichte as the restriction of the subject's freedom, but, rather, is taken to be the very expression of freedom.

Every object that the 'I' constructs as determining itself is ultimately constructed as a self-determination of the intelligent 'I.' Indeed, even if I am a "dogmatist" and try to construct myself as "not free" (=without a will), I presuppose what I try to deny, namely, the ultimate self-sufficiency of that thought as mine. The appearance of the will is as an absolute phenomenon, a given; and even the dogmatist or naturalist must take this for granted (31). Self-activity, if taken to be "the drive to absolute self-activity" (51), is, as Fichte indicates, only possible if the subject takes itself to be the originator of that drive, that is, "thinks of itself as free" (51). Intelligence, as such, is, therefore, practical, since the activity of the subject must be thought of as drive and as being free (53-55). Moreover, since the thought of being free is a determined and specific [bestimmt] thought, the determination of this intelligence must originate in itself. In Fichte's popular terminology: we take ourselves as entities that "have to" act. This "must," according to Fichte, ultimately takes on the form of an absolute ought and self-demand, since otherwise it could not be reconstructed as the activity of an intelligent agent. Drive and will are, then, ultimately the same thing, since every will implies a categorical moment: I will something because I determine the "willed" as something that I ought to realize. The intelligent agent, therefore -- to repeat this important point -- is, according to Fichte, never determined through something outside of itself. As such, intelligence is absolute substance, though Fichte himself does not use this term. Determined activity and freedom are two sides of the same coin.

In Fichte's ideal reconstruction, the system of drives turns out to be a system of the rational will. Fichte's strategy is based on his attempt to transform Kant's Second Critique into a metaphysics of subjectivity, since for Fichte the moral law [Sittengesetz] is the absolute condition of the possibility to be a self-consciousness and a rational being. In the end, self-consciousness is possible, precisely because the subject must design itself as being under the imperative of an absolute ought [Forderung], the consequence of which is that morality, for Fichte, becomes the center of human essence (52); it is not only a property of practical reason. Thinking is, at its very root, subject to this ought.

At this juncture, three important aspects of the System of Ethical Life, which are of importance for the reception of the System of Ethics, should be mentioned, namely: [1] It remains to be determined whether Fichte is really successful in arguing for a final transcendental theory that explains why we have to think ourselves necessarily under the moral law. Here, we must just hope that Fichte scholars will be able to "translate" Fichte's language into contemporary vocabulary. [2] Fichte's attempt to deduce concrete duties from the categorically determined will of a rational agent seems to be important for contemporary Kantian ethical theory; in this vein, it still remains to be decided whether Hegel is correct to assume that formal ethical theories are unable to generate ethical content. [3] The role of conscience, feeling, and faith within Post-Kantian philosophy should become clearer, not only in relation to the practical part of the Science of Knowledge and the later text Vocation of Man, but also in relation to Hegel's well known attacks on these concepts. We should underline that in this connection, Fichte's theory is extremely complex and needs a new confrontation with the Hegelian view. In addition, the whole Protestant tradition seems to originate in the Fichtean reconstruction of ethics; especially Kierkegaard's and Heidegger's Lutheranism seem to be rooted in Fichte's thought. To be sure, Fichte's conception is stimulating because it is not only an extreme example of a speculative theory of subjectivity, but astonishingly existentialistic: conscience, according to Fichte, is the "consciousness of our higher nature and of our absolute freedom" (140). In their conscience, we might say -- with a Heideggerian twist -- self-conscious and rational beings encounter and understand themselves in their being and transcendence. In this vein, recent literature has demonstrated Fichte's deep affinities with 20th Century Existentialism, perhaps most especially with Sartre's philosophy (see Wildenburg, Dorothea, Ist der Existentialismus ein Idealismus? Transzendentalphilosophische Analyse der Selbstbewußtseinstheorie des frühen Sartre aus der Perspektive der Wissenschaftslehre Fichtes. Fichte-Studien, Supplementa 17, Amsterdam: Rodopi, 2003).

In sum, Zöller's and Breazeale's translation and preparation of the text is superb. Every translator knows that translation is an extremely difficult endeavor, even though it is little appreciated by most academics. In addition, Fichte (as most of the German thinkers) was attuned to the possibilities of the German language, and he was not afraid of testing the limits of German words in the form of technical philosophical vocabulary, which makes Zöller's and Breazeale's work even more thoughtful and meticulous. The book also comes with a detailed index, a helpful introduction, a chronology, a list of further readings (with one exception, only English sources), and a detailed glossary.

To finish: Fichte - as a philosophical Protestant - would have taken the job of his translators as an ethical calling. As Fichte claims in the section entitled "Duties of the Scholar" (327-329), scholars and teachers are "supposed to advance humankind's cognition and not simply to play with it. Like every virtuous person, the scholar ought to forget himself in his end" (328). Fulfilling one's duty, as we know, is a cold business. Be that as it may, we should, moving beyond Fichte and beyond duty -- and perhaps even despite duty -- just thank Zöller and Breazeale for their fine work!