Systematic Atheology: Atheism's Reasoning with Theology

Placeholder book cover

John R. Shook, Systematic Atheology: Atheism's Reasoning with Theology, Routledge, 2018, 312 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138079984.

Reviewed by Chris Tweedt, Christopher Newport University


This book, "composed mainly for the edification of atheism's defenders," (p. 37) is an attempt to understand and defend atheism in an organized way. The book is divided into three sections. The first attempts to define 'atheist', 'atheology', and their relationship by tracking historical uses of the terms. The second is an extensive history of atheistic and atheological western philosophers, and the third, which occupies the last half of the book, is an attempt to systematically undermine every kind of argument for the existence of a god.

The book's primary strength is its extensive historical summary in chapters 5-6. Though not in depth and sometimes (though rarely) inaccurate, the summary would be an excellent starting point for those wishing to familiarize themselves with the history of atheism and atheology among western philosophers. (For the sake of brevity, this section is not addressed in the more detailed review below.)

The book's primary weaknesses are its lack of clarity and its absence of fair representation and careful analysis of theistic arguments. The third part contains simplistic versions of theistic arguments and cursory dismissals with significantly less carefulness and charity than one should expect from an academic philosophy book. It is worth noting that the level of care and effort in faithfully representing, objecting to, strengthening, and reexamining theistic arguments typical among philosophers of religion is not modeled by the brusqueness displayed in the second half of this book. It is a benefit to theist and atheist alike to enter into mutually considerate and serious intellectual dialogue, and this reviewer fears that, first, readers who are familiar with that kind of dialogue will be disappointed, and second, and more importantly, those who are not so familiar will be led to believe that the kind of dialogue in this book exemplifies the kind of exchange philosophers of religion typically undertake. I encourage readers to take the content of the second half of the book as one would take the content of a polemical Christian apologetics book -- as a preliminary consideration that is unrepresentative of respectful and careful intellectual dialogue displayed at philosophical conferences or even many social media discussions among philosophers.

Moving on to the individual sections, in the first, Shook defines atheism as the position that "convictions affirming a god are less than reasonable, so people should live a godless life." (p. 27) (The second part of the definition is to distinguish atheists from fideists.) On Shook's definition, atheism is not a belief about whether a god exists; instead, atheism is a belief about whether belief in a god is reasonable. (Shook does not distinguish or discuss what kinds of reasonableness are relevant.) Arguably, then, someone who finds herself with an unshakable belief that a god exists while also thinking such a belief is unreasonable could be an adherent of atheism on Shook's definition. In addition, someone who is convinced that a theistic argument is successful but refuses to believe or live as if a god exists would not be an adherent of atheism on Shook's definition.

Perhaps to overcome those counterintuitive results, Shook notes that atheists "deny that there is a god," (p. 25) and that some atheists are not adherents of atheism: "An atheist may not agree with atheism, the judgment that it is unreasonable for anyone to think that any god is real." (p. 26) There are too many issues to discuss here, but in short, Shook's definitions entail that those who believe a god exists but that the belief is unreasonable are not atheists but can nevertheless be adherents of atheism. And those who are convinced by a theistic argument but who refuse to believe or live as if a god exists are atheists but not adherents of atheism.

Atheology is usually defined as the attempt to show that it is unlikely that god exists. As Shook defines it, however, "Atheology specifically argues that atheism is a reasonable stance against god-belief." (p. 33) Substituting Shook's definition of atheism above, atheology is: the discipline that argues that it is reasonable to believe that it is unreasonable for anyone to believe that any god exists and that everyone should live a godless life.

Shook maintains, however, that one can engage in atheology without adhering to the larger atheological project. One can engage in atheology merely by arguing that belief in some god or other is unreasonable and that one should not live as if that particular god exists. As a result, Shook gives the "atheologian" label to Athanasius, a Christian Church father and defender of Trinitarianism, and Augustine, one of the most important theologians in Christian history (pp. 89, 91), because they argue that belief in non-Christian deities is unreasonable.

A little over halfway into the book, Shook begins his own atheological project. To do so, he organizes the project into four chapters, which roughly describe the tools used to undermine theistic arguments -- Rationalistic (which uses what Shook calls "rules of reason," p. 139), Scientific (which uses scientific findings), Moral (which uses objective moral norms), and Civic (which uses criteria for effective and legitimate governments).

Shook's project involves representing theistic arguments as deductive arguments and counting them as failures if the conclusion is not known with certainty. Shook dismisses arguments on the grounds that a premise's contradictory is true "for all we know," (p. 142) or "cannot be ruled out," (p. 149) and he rejects premises because "more nature could be responsible," (p. 144) "people do not agree," (p. 142) or the premise is "highly questionable." (p. 243) To the detriment of the project, it is never considered whether theistic arguments might be inductive, adding incremental confirmation to theism in order to form a cumulative case. In fact, in one place, Shook considers the argument that a benevolent god would ensure that humans have certain beneficial capabilities were that god to exist -- and humans do, in fact, have those capabilities. Instead of treating the argument as providing incremental confirmation for theism and countering by considering whether humans would have those capabilities if a benevolent god were not to exist, Shook dismisses the argument in one sentence: "These 'insights' all commit the fallacy of affirming the consequent." (p. 169) In the one paragraph in which Shook discusses inductive confirmation, the evidence-hypothesis relationship is stated incorrectly: "In common parlance, evidence 'E' typically counts as evidence for hypothesis 'H' just in case that if H were actually so, then E would be found." (p. 169) Whether one thing is evidence for another does not depend on whether it would be found, and if Shook's statement is correct, if H were not so, everything would count as evidence for it.

In the chapter on Rationalistic atheological methods, Shook sets up seven criteria for what makes an argument fail. These criteria are not elaborated upon or justified, except for the claim that the criteria follow from the principle of sufficient reason (PSR), which prevents "mystery" from entering into an explanation; the seven criteria are allegedly ways in which explanations are too mysterious to satisfy the PSR. (Shook's statements are ambiguous about what constitutes a reason, what makes a reason sufficient, whether the PSR is contrastive, what a mystery is, or why mysteries require violations of the PSR.) Shook treats all theistic arguments as deductive arguments that somehow show that a god is an explanans for some explanandum, and he constructs the following rules (p. 138-139):

Rule 1: Reject explanations that humans cannot comprehend.

Rule 2: Reject explanations that entail contradictions.

Rule 3: Reject explanations that beg the question.

Rule 4: Reject explanations in which a cause does not share anything in common with its purported effect.

Rule 5: Rejects explanations that are irrelevant or unjustified.

Rule 6: Reject explanations in which reasons for it could equally support alternative explanations.

Rule 7: Reject explanations that are exceptions to rational principles.

Almost all the work is done in the above principles and their application. Rule 1 prevents any argument from concluding that an incomprehensible god exists. (p. 147) Shook claims that Rule 3 is violated if theologians define god as a necessary being or as having any kind of perfection, (pp. 141, 143) that Rule 4 prevents a supernatural god from creating anything natural, (p. 146) and that Rule 5 requires that a god cannot create nature by an act of will. (p. 146) Rule 6 requires that if there is an (epistemically) possible naturalistic explanation for any phenomena, such as scientific paradigm shifts, then god's existence should be rejected as an explanation (p. 140, 150). Rule 7 requires that god has a cause because if everything else needs a cause, god does, too; a god cannot be the exception. (pp. 144, 146)

Here is a half-paragraph excerpt in which Shook uses the above rules to dismiss every theodicy (a theodicy is an explanation for why a god would allow the evils in the world). Note that this is not a summary; it is Shook's complete treatment of theodicies.

Theodicies lack clear and comprehensive explanations why observed evils are actually good, leaving matters in mystery (violating Rule 1), requiring the same thing to be essentially both evil and good (violating Rule 2), treating something as supremely good without proving a divine existence first (violating Rule 3), regarding evil as the responsibility of a perfectly good god (violating Rule 4), implying divine involvement without actually explaining it (violating Rule 5), blaming evil on a bad deity but leaving no reason for a good deity (violating Rule 6), or claiming that evil is necessarily from god but god is the singular being able to let evil happen without losing perfect goodness -- unlike humanity (violating Rule 7). (p. 153)

One might desire more justification for moves that so quickly and cavalierly accuse philosophers such as Aquinas, Leibniz, and Alvin Plantinga of violating the PSR by violating one of the above rules.

Shook addresses almost all the arguments for god's existence in the chapter on Rationalistic methods, except for the Moral argument (addressed later) and modal ontological arguments, which Shook does not address because "few theologians attempt them and even fewer theologians rest god-belief on them." (p. 141)

Shook also provides a psychological theory about why people would make design arguments -- it makes them feel wanted:

What actually lends seeming plausibility to the fine-tuning argument is a human need to feel special and wanted, not our knowledge due to science . . . The plausibility that religious people like to attach to [the design argument] springs from the cognitive-affective bias that tells people who win the lottery that god intended for them to win the lottery. (pp. 151-152)

In the chapter on Scientific atheological methods, Shook avers that, "Theories best surviving the tests of scientific inquiry are describing what the world is really doing," (p. 162) and thus, "If theology claims that it is an anomaly's connection to god that goes undetected by science, Scientific atheology replies that any supposed connection to a god is indemonstrable." (p. 166) For example, if someone witnesses a miracle, or an alleged violation of a law of nature, "Surely science would know better than any non-scientific opinion," whether there is such a deviation. A deviation from natural law is, rather, a sign that there is observational error, factors that haven't been taken into account, a refinement to the natural law, or another natural law needs to be added. (p. 168) Regarding medical "miracles" specifically, "In order for theology to know that a surprising medical recovery is naturally impossible, it would have to know far more about biochemistry, genetics, physiology, and neuroscience than science." (p. 169) Shook further claims that scientific knowledge can prevent people who believe that the supernatural occurs from being deceived and deceiving themselves (p. 168), and that, "Anomalous events are not miracles just because the faithful like to say so." (p. 166)

In the chapter on Moral atheological methods, Shook spends most of the chapter using the rules from the chapter on Rationalistic methods to object to arguments from a feature of morality to the existence of a god. It is often unclear what the feature is; it shifts without warning throughout the chapter between moral knowledge (p. 200), human natural capacity for knowledge (p. 201), objective morality itself (p. 201), an "explanation for why moral truths are true" (p. 202), and what is "important for knowing." (p. 206)

Shook rightly claims that atheists can believe, with theists, that there are objective moral truths without further justification (p. 203) but then argues that any version of theism according to which a god is causally responsible for moral truths must think that those moral truths are subjective, because they are dependent on that god. (p. 204) Of course, theists who agree that morality is objective do not thereby agree that morality cannot somehow be based on god; that's not the idea of objectivity to which the atheists and theists would initially agree.

Shook covers Pascal's Wager in the chapter on moral atheological methods. The wager in its general version uses rational decision theory to argue that if someone has any above-zero level of confidence that theism is true, they have a practical reason to believe that god exists, because if there is a god, there is a possibility of either infinite reward for believing or infinite punishment for disbelieving; if there is not a god, there is neither the possibility of infinite reward nor punishment. Since the benefits of believing (or costs of disbelieving) are so high, even a slight chance that theism is true should compel someone to believe. Surprisingly, Shook accuses the Wager of a contradiction between what he says are two preconditions for the wager: " (1) no one has good enough reasons to suspect either way that a god does or does not exist; and (2) everyone has good enough reason to suspect that one 'true' god(s) ensures an undesirable afterlife for unbelievers." (p. 216) Although (1) may be true of Pascal's specific version, with respect to the general version of the wager, Shook is incorrect; the wager presupposes neither (1) nor (2). Instead, it presupposes that someone has some, even if very slight, confidence that god exists, and that if god exists, then it is probable that either there is an infinite reward for so believing or an infinite punishment for not so believing. There is no contradiction there.

Finally, in the chapter on Civil atheological methods, Shook states that "nothing godly is responsible for politics or the ideals framing good government." (p. 223) Although Shook agrees that, "Religious convictions are evidently effective forces in the political realm," he asks, "but is there a real god behind that faith?" (p. 224) Here, Shook is redirecting the conversation to other theistic arguments. In addition, he maintains that, conceivably, ethics alone can do the work that religion can do in supporting effective and legitimate governments: "There is no necessary connection between religion and universal ethics, and no mandatory relationship between religious institutions and enforcing universal ethics." (p. 243)

Shook is commendable for his historical summaries -- of uses of the terms 'atheist' and 'atheology' in section 1 and of western philosophers who were atheists or atheologians in section 2. To his credit, Shook also criticizes the New Atheist movement for both offering "at best an entryway into practical atheology," and sharply wielding skepticism "against anything religious, while no skepticism is permitted about science's capacity to explain the world or materialism's delivery of fulfilling human lives." (p. 55) Unfortunately, the atheological project here does not seem much different.