Systematicity: The Nature of Science

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Paul Hoyningen-Huene, Systematicity: The Nature of Science, Oxford University Press, 2013, 287pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199985050.

Reviewed by Darrell P. Rowbottom, Lingnan University


In this epic tale, Sir Paul mounts his charger and sallies forth on a quest which nary a noble Knight afore him has completed. He seeks not the Grail, but only a morsel of wisdom. He searches earnestly for an answer to "What is science?" But does he prevail, and achieve enlightenment? Or does he falter, and succumb to the dark fey of ignorance? Read on only if you don't mind some spoilers!

Lacking the wit to continue in the same vein -- or, at least, the expectation that doing so will entertain the reader -- I will cut to the chase as soon as I can. But we need a little preparatory work. First, Hoyningen-Huene (henceforth, 'HH') uses 'science' in a broad sense, akin to 'Wissenschaft'; this encompasses any branch of study in the contemporary academy, from aesthetics to zoology. Second, HH's project is primarily descriptive, rather than normative; it has an empirical focus. Third, HH does not presume that there is an essence to science. He proposes instead that there are connections of family resemblance between historical and contemporary disciplines, and argues that systematicity is an umbrella concept that covers these. This final aspect may be a bit tricky to grasp with such a brief description, but I shall return to it. I raise it now in order to flag one way in which my fairytale-style beginning could give a false (and unfair) impression.

The Main Thesis

So why did I use a fairytale analogy to begin? Primarily, though not wholly, because HH appears to use a bait-and-switch tactic in order to entice the reader. He starts out by waxing lyrical about the centrality of "What is science?" to the general philosophy of science:

What question if not the question, "What is science?". . . should be discussed . . . by a discipline legitimately called philosophy of science? (xi)

The central question to be answered by a general philosophy of science is: What is science? As obvious as this may seem, only few works in today's philosophy of science deal with this fundamental question in its full scope. (1)

[O]ne should be aware that the question about the nature of science is the central question of general philosophy of science, and one should develop a stance toward it. Simply avoiding the question will not do. (5)

These are not only bold, but also bald, assertions. The possibility of doing general philosophy of science by trusting to our ability to distinguish science from non-science reliably, on the basis of tacit knowledge (qua know how), is not considered. But curiously, HH appears to rely on his possession of tacit knowledge to a considerable extent, in drawing contrasts between science and non-science. For example, he merely declares that chess theory is 'clearly' not a science (155). So it looks as if the possibility of science-first general philosophy of science -- to draw an analogy with Timothy Williamson's knowledge-first research programme in epistemology -- is implicitly admitted by the manner in which HH proceeds. This will come as some solace to those self-styled philosophers of science who opine that "What is science?" is not only legitimately avoidable, but also wise to avoid. Note that this is not to deny the wider social importance of answering questions such as "How might pseudoscience be identified?" -- or "What is science not?" -- to deal with practical issues such as whether so-called 'creation science' should be taught alongside evolutionary theory in a biology class. (That is, although Laudan (1982 & 1983) makes a strong case that we would do better to focus on the lack of evidence for many of the claims advanced by creation scientists, and their ilk, legal context permitting.)

But let's return to the alleged bait and switch. Curiously, for all the emphasis on the importance of answering 'What is science?', the book's main thesis is really:

Scientific knowledge differs from other kinds of knowledge, in particular from everyday knowledge, primarily by being more systematic. (14)

For illustrative purposes, imagine that this thesis is true. Does this tell us what science is? Not unless several contentious assumptions are smuggled in. Crucially, knowledge -- even in the peculiar sense intended by HH, which we will come to shortly -- may be a contingent aspect of science. Indeed, there is an ongoing debate about the significance of knowledge, in the standard epistemological sense, in characterising scientific progress. (See Bird 2007 & 2008, Rowbottom 2008 & 2009, Cevolani and Tambolo 2013, and Mizrahi Forthcoming.) And even if knowledge is central to science, comparing scientific knowledge with other forms of knowledge may still shed little light on the characteristic qualities of science. To see this, imagine a book called 'What are oranges?' It begins with a proclamation of the centrality of its titular question for orange studies. But its main thesis is later revealed to be: oranges differ from apples primarily in so far as they are compartmental! Would you feel misled? Cheated, even? Yes, I'd venture, despite the fact that the thesis dutifully compares fruit with fruit. (And no form of essentialism has been assumed in advancing this criticism.)

But so what, if the book involves some false advertising? It may nevertheless be a good product. And isn't it shoddy -- the preserve of angry young reviewers, overeager to score career points, even -- to damn a book on the basis that the author doesn't achieve her stated aims? Yes. I point to a defect, but not of a catastrophic variety. And HH reports having argued that 'Science is systematic knowledge' (x) in earlier work, which may partially explain why he presented the book in this way. So let's delve a little deeper.


Prima facie, the main thesis is fascinating. Might this book not bridge some longstanding gaps between philosophy of science and epistemology? Might its focus on knowledge lead to some new insights for the former, on the basis of the latter, given the blossoming of social epistemology -- and especially work on testimony, disagreement, and judgement aggregation -- in the recent past? No, because HH's 'knowledge' is not what you might expect. On the contrary, it is explained as a:

body of belief . . . that is well-established, widely held in the relevant community, not regarded as tentative or falsified. (21)

In fact, HH fails to engage with contemporary epistemology at all, beyond citing a couple of encyclopaedia-level pieces, even though it remains strikingly relevant (e.g. in cashing out 'well-established' and 'held in the relevant community'). As such, the book represents a missed opportunity.

Moreover, HH also fails to stick to this initial definition of 'knowledge', instead using something closer to the standard epistemological notion, at key junctures. In particular, there is definitional drift in two separate dimensions: (a) concerning whether knowledge entails truth (or some appropriate surrogate, e.g. probable truth); and (b) concerning whether knowledge requires a 'relevant community' (i.e., operates only at a community-level). (There are also some points at which HH's 'knowledge' does not require belief -- what HH calls 'knowledge production' is sometimes 'information production' -- but I will put this complaint to one side, in the interests of brevity.)

With respect to the former, HH asserts, for example, that: 'If we had in our daily life somehow systematic processes to generate novel knowledge, the sciences would immediately take up these procedures and systematize them further.' (133) Grant the assumption that the sciences could recognize such processes, and forget the ill-advised use of 'immediate'. Why would science adopt said procedures, if knowledge does not entail truth (or approximate truth, empirical adequacy, or some other appropriate substitute)? Is 'well-established' supposed to have a link to justification or warrant? And thereby to truth, say? We are left to guess.

With respect to the latter, beliefs at the individual level are often compared with beliefs at the community-level in science, when the 'main thesis' is advanced. For example, HH writes:

Many of us use computers for e-mail. Many of us turn to the Internet in order to get pertinent medical information. And so on. However, in everyday practice, the use of other knowledge resources is typically spotty and selective -- just the opposite of the systematic exploitation of other knowledge resources as it is done by the sciences. (140)

it is plausible . . . for everyday knowledge that we expand it on the basis of existing knowledge. However, we seldom do that systematically. We simply add what our situation demands and what is in our reach. (141)

Even stranger is that HH sometimes deliberately rules out comparisons between science and other community-level endeavours:

Think of banks, insurances [sic], the legal system, the military, or the administration. I am not claiming that the sciences' social organization is more systematically structured with respect to securing knowledge quality than these societal fields. Neither do I know this, nor is this really relevant here. I am only emphasizing that . . . with respect to its social organization, science displays a high degree of systematicity, certainly higher than anything comparable in our day-to-day lives. (110)

What is supposed to be comparable in our day-to-day lives? I emerge uninstructed, despite having read assiduously. But enough said about this. Let's forge ahead. A discussion of the central notion in the book, systematicity itself, awaits.


Even if what counts as 'everyday knowledge' is unclear, the gist of the main thesis is evident. Roughly, I take it to be as follows: sciences are especially systematic qua members of the class of belief-changing activities undertaken by groups of people. (Actually, HH appears to want to argue that each and every science is more systematic than any other non-science in the appropriate ('everyday') reference class. But this could be false, and the objective probability of higher systematicity could remain very high. So we should cut him some slack on this point.)

We are left to wonder what the claim about systematicity amounts to. But the answer is inelegant. HH says that there are:

nine dimensions . . . of science in which science is more systematic than other kinds of knowledge . . . My main thesis will decompose correspondingly into nine distinct theses, claiming higher systematicity (in a context dependent sense) for each of those dimensions . . . (27)

And the dimensions are:

- descriptions,
- explanations,
- predictions,
- the defense of knowledge [?] claims,
- critical discourse,
- epistemic connectedness,
- an ideal of completeness,
- knowledge [?] generation, and
- the representation of knowledge. [?] (27)

I will not devote space to explaining every item on this list, because this will take us into too much detail. Thankfully, the majority are self-explanatory. Instead, I want to focus on HH's way of proceeding.

HH admits that 'the abstract notion of systematicity' only 'provides some tenuous sort of unity' and is 'extremely thin' (169). And after noting that making comparisons of overall systematicity inevitably involves aggregrating comparisons in (many or all of) the aforementioned dimensions, HH adds:

[T]he statement of a difference in the degree of systematicity between two areas is extremely abstract and therefore "thin" or, to put it in more unfriendly terms, very vague. Not much is put on the table by such a statement, and correspondingly, it will be difficult to refute it. However, this property of systematicity theory is not a vice, but a virtue. Necessarily, all general statements of systematicity theory are abstract and cannot have much content because of the enormous diversity they are designed to cover. They are an attempt not to shut up in confrontation with the diversity of countless disciplines, subfields, and their historical development, but to state something that is general and abstract enough to deal with this diversity, without becoming entirely empty. Therefore, a refutation of the general theses of systematicity theory by empirical examples is in principle possible, in spite of the theory's enormous flexibility. (169)

Where HH sees a virtue, I see a vice. First, systematicity is so vague that it is hard to see what it adds to the discussion of the ways in which specific sciences exhibit differences between one another -- and 'everyday knowledge' -- in the aforementioned dimensions. Why not list the dimensions, and point to the specific kinds of difference in each? Why hold out for such skeletal generality? It seems relatively useless, both intellectually and practically. A statement like 'scientific knowledge is more systematic than everyday knowledge' will not help a philosopher to grasp HH's ('decomposed') thesis. Nor will it help a judge to decide whether so-called creation science should be taught alongside evolutionary theory.

Second, it is unclear how one would refute 'systematicity theory' at the abstract level. For if one found a new way in which many sciences differed from 'everyday knowledge', whatever that is, would HH not be able to incorporate this by adding another dimension? And if one found that it was possible to ignore one of the dimensions mentioned above, might HH not claim that the scope of systematicity should be narrowed? The claim of falsifiability is left as vague as the talk of systematicity. HH does not say what he thinks it would take to show that his main thesis is false (when it is not in a 'decomposed' form).

So the fairytale analogy with which I began is apt, I contend, even if I am wrong about the bait and switch issue raised much earlier. Yet several useful insights would remain in the book, were all talk of 'systematicity' to be removed. And I will come to this in closing. Before I do, I should mention that HH ends the book by discussing how his approach to demarcating scientific knowledge and 'everyday knowledge' relates to previous work on demarcation in the philosophy of science, e.g. by Popper. (He is inaccurate on Popper, but that's de rigueur in contemporary philosophy of science.) He also explains how his use of 'systematicity' differs from Rescher's. The short answer is that HH is more focused on 'systematic' whereas Rescher (1979) is more focused on 'system'.

In Closing

I have been almost entirely critical in my previous discussion, although many parts of this book are good. In fact, HH tends to be at his best when he's working at the level of the trees, rather than that of the woods. For example, he provides an interesting discussion of reproducibility and descriptions (39 -- 40), offers a neat overview of the forms and roles of prediction in different sciences (78 -- 80), and makes a number of insightful observations about standards for 'the defense of knowledge claims' in different fields (90). Commendably, HH is also careful to highlight many of the weaknesses of the book (e.g. on xi).

Maybe there is also one final sense in which my opening is apt. It takes great courage to be a Knight, to fight for abstract ideals, in the knowledge that a painful death almost certainly awaits. And there are too few Knights, although there are numerous men-at-arms (and 'men' is sadly apt), nowadays.

Alas, the book contains several careless factual mistakes, and numerous typological or grammatical gaffes. Amusing examples of the former include: 'The question may arise of how many different regular polyhedra exist. The answer is that there are exactly five . . . So if you want to know everything about polyhedra, you do so if you know these five and you know that there are no others.' (128), and 'In order to find out what properties particles have, one has to bring them to collisions.' (136)

Entertaining examples of the latter include: 'critically asses' (112), 'the optical telescope was continuously . . . improved' (134), 'the function y=3x assigns to every value of x the value 3x' (143), and 'Ron Harré' (266). 'It is obvious that' is repeatedly used in contexts where the relevant claims are far from obvious (41, 43, 46, 49, 53, 58). If they were obvious, indeed, pages 41 -- 58 could largely be omitted.

Overall, reading the book felt rather like panning for gold. I found several nuggets, although I discarded much material. Perhaps I wasn't systematic enough in my panning? It's hard to tell.


Thanks to Paisley Livingston and Julian Reiss for comments on a draft of this review.


Bird, A. 2007. What Is Scientific Progress? Noûs 41, 64-89.

Bird, A. 2008. Scientific Progress as Accumulation of Knowledge -- A Reply to Rowbottom. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 39, 279-281.

Cevolani, G. and L. Tambolo. 2013. Progress as Approximation to the Truth: A Defence of the Verisimilitudinarian Approach. Erkenntnis 78, 921-935.

Laudan, L. 1982. Commentary: Science at the Bar -- Causes for Concern. Science, Technology and Human Values 7, 16-19.

Laudan, L. 1983. More on Creationism. Science, Technology and Human Values 8, 36-38.

Mizrahi, M. Forthcoming. What Is Scientific Progress? Lessons from Scientific Practice. Journal for General Philosophy of Science.

Rescher, N. 1979. Cognitive Systematization: A Systems-Theoretic Approach to a Coherentist Theory of Knowledge. Oxford: Blackwell.

Rowbottom, D. P. 2008. N-Rays and the Semantic View of Scientific Progress. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 39, 277-278.

Rowbottom, D. P. 2010. What Scientific Progress Is Not: Against Bird's Epistemic View. International Studies in the Philosophy of Science 24, 241-255.