T. H. Green: Ethics, Metaphysics, and Political Philosophy

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Maria Dimova-Cookson and W. J. Mander (eds.), T. H. Green: Ethics, Metaphysics, and Political Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2006, 321pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199271666.

Reviewed by James W. Allard, Montana State University


This volume consists of an editors' introduction followed by eleven papers.  The contributors are well known and all of them have written other essays or books on Green's work.  Earlier versions of the papers by Gerald F. Gaus and Avital Simhony have been previously published; the other papers appear here for the first time.  As the title indicates, the papers focus on different aspects of Green's ethics, metaphysics, and political philosophy and these are topics to which the introduction orients prospective readers.  The introduction also briefly describes the papers, gives a short history of the decline and partial rehabilitation of Green's reputation, and identifies the purpose of the volume, which is "to reflect and to stimulate that process of rehabilitation" (1).

The fact that there is new interest in Green's work is surprising.  The middle Victorian conflict between science and religion and the social problems arising from rapid industrialization provided the impetus for Green's philosophy.  Green responded to these crises by developing a distinctive evangelical liberalism in which an absolute idealistic metaphysics provided the ground for reconciling science and religion.  It also provided the basis for an ethic of realizing oneself in pursuit of the common good and a political philosophy in which the purpose of the state was to mobilize the resources that would enable its citizens to achieve the common good.  This required the state to act as guarantor of rights and of what Green famously called "freedom in the positive sense."  It was in this role that Green saw the state as ameliorating the evils of rapid industrialization. 

During the closing years of the nineteenth century Green's vision was tremendously attractive and widely admired.  But the end of the Victorian age, the cataclysms of the two world wars, and the new and decidedly different problems of the 20th century led to a sharp decline in its influence.  Although some residual interest in Green remained, his philosophy was increasingly neglected.  This situation began to change as a result of the end of the cold war and the resulting reconfiguration of political philosophy.  As the editors note, during the 1980's a revival of interest in Green's philosophy was occasioned by his account of the way in which individuals are social creatures.  Debates between liberals and communitarians and attempts to find alternatives to Marxian socialism further stimulated interest in Green's work.  Green seemed worth revisiting in this context because his defense of positive liberty is based on a notion of the common good and because Green is sometimes said to have laid a foundation for the welfare state.

There are, however, at least three difficulties to be confronted if this rehabilitation is to continue.  First, despite the fact that Green's sudden and premature death prevented him from elaborating his metaphysics in detail, his philosophy is a surprisingly unified whole.  His political philosophy rests on the notion of the common good developed in his ethics and this notion appears to be in turn dependent on his idealistic metaphysics.  Because his metaphysics seems uncongenial to the demands of the present age, however, it needs to be either defended or detached from his moral and political philosophy.  If this can be dealt with, then a second difficulty appears, this time with Green's ethics.  This difficulty besets British idealism in virtually all its forms, and Green's ethics is no exception.  Green based his ethics on an account of human agency in which moral action is a process of what he called "self-realization" through pursuing the common good.  Green's way of expressing himself here and elsewhere in his ethics is difficult for contemporary readers, and it seems remote from their concerns.  If it is to provide a basis for Green's political theory, it must be explained in a more transparent vocabulary and defended.  The third difficulty is that even if Green's ethics can be put in an intelligible and defensible form, it still needs to be shown that his ideas make a contribution to contemporary political theory.  It is to these tasks that the present volume is primarily addressed. 

The first difficulty is presented by Green's absolute idealism.  Although often referred to as Hegelian, Green's idealism is of a rather different variety.  Its central idea is that knowledge is always knowledge of related objects and that relations are the products of thought.  From this Green concluded that reality as we know it is a product of thought.  But, Green continues, since the thought of which the whole of known reality is a product is not that of a limited finite mind, there must be an all-inclusive mind in which finite minds participate.  Green referred to this all-inclusive mind as an "eternal consciousness."  Although Green did not argue for the divinity of his eternal consciousness, he did sometimes refer to it as divine.  Claiming that knowledge presupposed the existence of such a mind allowed him to reconcile the existence of scientific knowledge with religious faith.  As W. J.  Mander notes in his paper, a fundamental problem here "is simply that of finding any account of his meaning sufficiently clear and detailed to assess" (188). Assuming this can be found, the difficulty is then to either defend Green's metaphysics, perhaps with some modification, or to detach it from his moral and political philosophy.  Five of the papers in this volume, those by Mander, Leslie Armour, Peter Nicholson, Andrew Vincent, and David O. Brink, address this issue.  Mander, Armour, Nicholson, and Vincent all defend some version of Green's metaphysics, while Brink attempts to detach it.

Mander's paper, "In Defense of the Eternal Consciousness," identifies and responds to the main objections that have been made to Green's eternal consciousness.  These objections are directed against either the fact that it is eternal (i.e., timeless) or the fact that it is conscious.  In each case the objections target difficulties in the eternal consciousness in itself or in its relation to the world and the finite minds in it.  Once the objections are identified in this way, it becomes possible to see that many of them are found in classical religious conceptions of God and are by no means conclusive.  To take just one example, it seems problematic to say, as Green does, that the eternal consciousness is eternally complete and yet that it expresses itself progressively and never completely in time.  But as Mander shows, Green can respond by following Kant in treating time as the form of experience in finite minds and the progressive manifestation of the eternal consciousness as a feature of finite consciousness rather than of the eternal consciousness itself.  From his examination, Mander concludes that Green's unmodified account of the eternal consciousness can be defended, at least as a viable hypothesis, against the many criticisms that have been advanced against it. 

Armour disagrees.  His paper, "Green's Idealism and the Metaphysics of Ethics," argues that Green attributes incompatible characteristics, eternity and agency, to his eternal consciousness.  Armour also thinks that Green's individual moral agents need to have a conception of the common good in order to act and that they only acquire this conception through participation in the eternal consciousness.   The problem, then, is to find a coherent interpretation of the eternal consciousness suited to Green's purposes.  Following McTaggart, Armour suggests that the only available conception is to take the eternal consciousness as infinite love expressing itself in the world.  This individuates moral agents because love requires multiple recipients, but at the same time unites these recipients in the way that Green's pursuit of the common good requires.

In contrast to Armour's full metaphysical interpretation of the eternal consciousness, Nicholson and Vincent defend minimal interpretations.   Nicholson's paper, "Green's 'Eternal Consciousness,'" relies on a distinction between critical metaphysics and speculative metaphysics drawn from the work of Green's student, D. G. Ritchie.  According to Ritchie, critical metaphysics purports to establish the formal, a priori conditions for human knowledge.  Nicholson takes Green's argument for the existence of an eternal consciousness, which he carefully summarizes, as a piece of critical metaphysics.  But he takes Green's remarks about the nature of the eternal consciousness, specifically Green's references to it as Divine, as speculative metaphysics.  Metaphysics in this form attempts to infer the nature of the universe from what is known about it, and its adequacy is measured by the extent to which it can explain features of the known universe. As such, it is dependent on what is known at any particular time and therefore not capable of achieving certainty.  Drawing this distinction and treating Green's argument for the existence of an eternal consciousness as a piece of critical metaphysics allows Nicholson to conclude that it is only the minimal interpretation of the eternal consciousness as a formal principle that Green requires as a ground for his moral and political philosophy.  For it is as a formal principle that the eternal consciousness plays a role in explaining how human agency is possible. 

Vincent's paper, "Metaphysics and Ethics in the Philosophy of T. H. Green," offers another minimal interpretation, but it approaches the task in a rather different way.  Vincent begins by identifying a tension between two strands of Green's ethics.  According to one strand, ethics is primarily concerned to comprehend already existing moral ideas expressed in social institutions.  Because these ideas develop progressively through history -- because of the agency of the eternal consciousness, not because of the initiative of reform-minded individuals -- the role of philosophy is to understand rather than to enjoin.  At the same time, however, a great deal of Green's attractiveness for his contemporaries was found in the way in which his philosophy supported or seemed to support moral reforms that could be initiated by individuals.  According to this second strand, moral philosophy provides not only a basis for understanding but also for criticizing and improving existing moral practices.  Vincent argues that while Green did not live to resolve this tension, he did become aware of it and that in order to deal with it he began to disengage his conception of the individual struggling moral agent from the agency of the eternal consciousness.  Vincent then sketches a way in which Green might have reconciled the two strands by abandoning his insistence on the agency of the eternal consciousness. 

Brink's paper, "Self-Realization and the Common Good: Themes in T. H. Green," presents a perfectionist interpretation of Green's ethics which it then uses as a basis for understanding the common good without reliance on the eternal consciousness.  The goal of the paper, now incorporated into Brink's book, Perfectionism and the Common Good: Themes in the Philosophy of T. H. Green, is to present a defensible version of Green's ethics that makes a contribution to contemporary ethical theory and provides a basis for Green's liberalism. If successful, this deals with the second difficulty in rehabilitating Green, the one posed by the obscurity of his ethical theory.  According to Brink's interpretation, the good consists in the full development or perfection of one's nature.  For Green this consists in perfecting one's rational, deliberative capacities.  In setting forth this interpretation, Brink reconstructs Green's account of how duties are grounded in the desires agents have for what they conceive to be their own goods.  Then using Aristotelian friendship as an analogy, he shows how the goods of different individuals are interdependent.  This provides a basis for Green's account of the common good without invoking any sort of participation in the eternal consciousness.  Interpreting the common good in this way, rather than in terms of some sort of organicism, allows Brink to formulate a defensible version of Green's ethics that does not rely on idealistic metaphysics. 

The other two papers on Green's ethics, those by John Skorupski and T. H. Irwin, avoid his metaphysics and are more critical of his ethics.  Skorupski's paper, "Green and the Idealistic Conception of a Person's Good," is a partial defense of Green's account of a person's good.  Unlike Brink, Skorupski rejects Green's attempt to construct a person's good from what that person desires.  A person's good, Skorupski argues, is to be defined in terms of what a person has reason to desire.   On this basis he examines Green's (modified) claim that what one has reason to desire is one's self-realization or freedom in the positive sense.  Green reaches this conclusion by arguing that what one has reason to desire is the exercise and enhancement of one's rational agency and that because rational agency is moral agency and moral agency is freedom in the positive sense, one's good is freedom in the positive sense.  Skorupski argues that Green is able to link rational agency with moral agency only by taking moral ideals as absolutely desirable.  While Skorupski accepts the value of moral ideals, he rejects taking them as the only ideals and he rejects Green's treatment of them as binding in the way that moral obligations are.

Irwin's paper, "Green's Criticism of the British Moralists," focuses on a problem in Green: why such a historically careful and sensitive writer should have treated the British moralists in so cavalier a fashion.  Irwin finds part of the answer in Green's Oxford context in which the writings of Kant were replacing those of Butler as a way of reconciling Greek virtues with Christianity, and part in Green's treatment of the history of philosophy as a history of epistemology.  This reading of history placed the British moralists in the empiricist tradition among the successors of Locke.  Green thought that this tradition had played out and that progress in ethics was to be made by studying the works of Kant and Hegel.  Had Green followed Whewell in approaching the British moralists metaphysically and normatively, he might well have seen, Irwin argues, that Butler's position on the dualism of practical reason was distinctive and might have been discussed by Green with advantage.

The remaining four papers, by Gaus, Simhony, Colin Tyler, and Maria Dimova-Cookson, illustrate the sorts of contributions that Green is capable of making to contemporary political philosophy, especially with respect to rights.  Green defined a right as "a power claimed and recognized as contributory to the common good" (209).  Gaus' very impressive paper, "The Rights Recognition Thesis: Defending and Extending Green," is a straightforward defense of one component in this claim, that moral rights require recognition, and by extension that political rights require it as well. One objection to the claim is that something must exist prior to being recognized.  Gaus meets this by noting that this is so only on one model of recognition.  A chair of a meeting may recognize a speaker, but in doing so gives the speaker a status that the speaker did not previously have.  Using this model of recognition, Gaus argues that if a moral agent has a duty, then Green's motivational internalism requires that the agent recognize the desirability of acting according to the duty and thereby be motivated.  So if, as Green thought, rights are correlative with duties, then to have a duty is to recognize that someone has a correlative right. Gaus extends this to political philosophy by explaining how this sort of rational recognition can be connected with social recognition. 

Simhony's paper, "Rights that Bind: T.H Green on Rights and Community," constructs Green's response to the common communitarian criticism of liberalism that the liberal stress on rights erodes the bonds of community.  Simhony divides this criticism into three claims: that the liberal concept of rights conceptually requires atomistic individuals, that the liberal vision of politics requires antithetical relations between individuals and their communities, and that the rights recognized in liberalism are negative rights.  She then shows how Green responds to these criticisms by connecting rights with recognition and hence with social individuals, how social individuals have noninstrumental, common concerns, and why this requires a liberal state to guarantee positive freedoms. 

Tyler's paper, "Contesting the Common Good: T.H. Green and Contemporary Republicanism," argues that Green's distinctive conception of positive freedom requires Green to accept a republican conception of freedom and the values associated with it, specifically the need for social recognition, civic virtue, and political participation.  Green's interpretation of true freedom in pursuit of a common good, Tyler argues, requires the republican form of freedom in which moral agents are free from arbitrary interference in the public sphere. This is made possible by Green's view that moral agents acquire their status through social recognition in the pursuit of a common good.  This in turn requires Green to accept the republican value of civic virtue.  The common good can only be attained through the active life of a citizen, a life in which, Tyler argues, differences about the character of the common good, its contested nature, spur individuals in their moral development.

Dimova-Cookson's paper, "Resolving Moral Conflicts: British Idealist and Contemporary Liberal Approaches to Value Pluralism and Moral Conduct," juxtaposes Green's way of resolving conflicts between duties in personal morality with the way Rawls and Nagel resolve conflicts between conflicting conceptions of the good in determining the basic principles of political institutions.  Dimova-Cookson takes the liberal form of conflict resolution offered by Rawls and Nagel to resolve conflicts between conflicting conceptions of the good, by adopting higher, universal principles of right, the principles of justice.  This, Dimova-Cookson continues, threatens to undermine ordinary moral commitments to one's conception of the good.  As an alternative, she describes T.H. Green's way of resolving moral conflicts by means of one's moral motivation and this, she argues, reinforces rather than undermines an agent's conception of the good. 

Taken as a whole, the papers in this volume reflect and contribute to the current rehabilitation of Green's philosophy.  Their most important contribution is to confront the difficulties in Green's philosophy.  They do this by showing that his metaphysics can either be defended or detached from his moral and political philosophy and that both his moral and his political philosophy have much to contribute to contemporary debate.