Tacit Knowledge

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Neil Gascoigne and Tim Thornton, Tacit Knowledge, Acumen, 2013, 210pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844655465.

Reviewed by Esther L. Meek, Geneva College


Despite a wake of cultural destruction and a legacy of powerful challenges, the modern Western ideal of knowledge as calculable and codifiable, and of knowledge so construed as the key to powerful mastery of nature, nevertheless continues to entrench and expand. In recent decades its aspirations have taken a quantum leap with the development of computer internet information technology and advances in neuroscience. Of course, we continue to benefit from an ongoing cascade of breakthroughs. Yet something seems rotten, especially as with growing frequency we also find ourselves handcuffed and victimized by a massive indifference to real need, real value, real good, real people, and real wisdom. Where, in such an ideal, is there room for these? How is it that such a powerful knowledge ideal sidelines good judgment (1-3, 192)? This is a most critical question in our age.

This book is a sustained effort to address this critical situation by offering an epistemological proposal that challenges the regnant ideal. Neil Gascoigne and Tim Thornton are concerned with the interface of philosophy and psychiatry, as well as of these with the burgeoning field of neuroscience. That their proposal is an epistemology is itself significant, for some voices have sidelined this discipline wholesale. And that they have the temerity to take a stand for tacit knowledge might initially be seen by healthcare professionals, in this era of evidence-based medicine, as heroic, bordering on professional suicide. But even a cursory scan of the book will quickly assure the reader that its authors have a massive amount of explicit, detailed claims and arguments to make about tacit knowledge, along with a daunting amount of philosophical research on which to base them. And it is worth noting that the authors tacitly presume that to challenge the regnant ideal of explicitly codifiable knowledge, one must show how tacit knowledge nevertheless measures up to it. That is to say, the argument tacitly accepts the very ideal it seeks to challenge.

Gascoigne and Thornton present a philosophical account of tacit knowledge; that is, of the existence of a kind of knowledge that is not codifiable in context-independent terms and thus is tacit, but that is nevertheless knowledge in that it has content that is articulable without remainder. It is important to distinguish a non-codifiable knowledge that is not inarticulable. That's what "tacit knowledge" means, according to the authors. They propose that tacit knowledge is context-dependent yet conceptually structured, and it is practical knowledge -- know-how -- that intrinsically involves a practitioner. Tacit knowledge, they aver, is articulable through practical demonstration, in reference to specific contexts, employing demonstratives; for example, do this, here, now (3-7, 191-92). In this way, tacit knowledge can be justified as being both tacit and knowledge, and thus as existing and being the sort of thing doctors may be expected to rely upon in the form of good judgment.

Gascoigne and Thornton build their account in conversation with an array of philosophical partners. Among philosophers of earlier centuries, they especially attend to Kant and Aristotle. From the twentieth century they draw on Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Wittgenstein (on whom Thornton has a separate book), Ryle, and Polanyi. They engage an impressive span of contemporaries on this topic, including most notably John McDowell (Thornton has a book on him also), Herbert Dreyfus, and John Searle --  along with commentators on all of them. The bibliography displays the breadth of the authors' engagement.

The book begins with a kind of honorary discussion of Michael Polanyi, whom Gascoigne and Thornton credit for initiating the claim to tacit knowledge and for affording them two of its key motifs. They attend to Polanyi, Ryle and Wittgenstein, whom they deem "three sources of tacit knowledge," to develop their own preliminary account of tacit knowledge. And then they fire their account, so to speak, in the kilns of discussions regarding Ryle's knowing-how and Wittgenstein's rule-following, putative challenges from Searle's idea of the Background, a phenomenology-inspired idea of nonconceptual content, reflection on Aristotelian phronesis, and finally the interconnectedness of language and tacit knowledge.

Overall, the work is a prodigious engagement of all sorts of relevant literature, propounding a carefully crafted thesis and defense of tacit knowledge. Taken as a whole, the book's overarching argument is professionally and intentionally forwarded. The argument is generally clear, but extensive and quite detailed. The reader never loses the thread of it for long, as the authors systematically martial each smaller discussion in support of their project. But as a result, the going is slow and challenging. Occasionally the authors' representation and critique of others' positions involves hasty misrepresentation and dismissal in favor of their own precise thesis. It would take an entire panel of its dialogue partners in conference to assess the overall argument, each weighing in to scrutinize the significantly smaller and more manageable portion in which they are expert. Yet each subgroup should consider Tacit Knowledge a substantive, fresh contribution to its own ongoing debate.

This reviewer brings to this assessment of the argument a working understanding of Michael Polanyi's epistemology. Admittedly, this is one camp among many from which the authors forage; however, they do designate it as formative for their project. Thus, my discomfort with their treatment of Polanyian epistemology has bearing on my trust in the entire venture.

Any Polanyian is thrilled simply to have Polanyi's work engaged; far more often than not, he doesn't even appear in a book's index. In this respect, I deeply appreciate Gascoigne and Thornton's effort. And, in fact, it might well be that some recasting of Polanyi's claims is needed if his thought is even to be heard by the vast majority of people in the modern West who are still married to the ideal of knowledge as codifiability, to use the authors' term. And then perhaps a taste might tantalize, and people might read him for themselves.

However, readers of Tacit Knowledge are as likely as not to leave it with a greater distaste for Polanyi and a radical misunderstanding of his central claim. While the authors credit him with originating the idea of tacit knowledge, they have apparently failed to understand what he was saying. Also, they make it clear that from their perspective his version is contradictory (inarticulable knowledge is not knowledge, 5), unsupported (they partially quote philosopher Marjorie Grene to represent that Polanyi did not offer philosophical arguments, 14), and not "svelte" (in contrast to their own, 37). They dub his work "inflationary mysticism" (7), and "outdated Platonism" (they misread Polanyi as if he had actually so designated his own ideas, 6).

The two phrases the authors cite are Polanyi's well-known but not entirely helpful aphorism, "we know more than we can tell," and his description of knowing as "an active comprehension of things known, an action that requires skill" (3-5, et passim). From these they draw the titular idea of tacit knowledge and the idea of it as skill, motifs central to their own proposal. But not only does this move prevent them from tapping the full resources of what Polanyi could offer their important project, it also leads them positively to misrepresent Polanyian epistemology. It took a good deal of effort, with only partial success, to reconcile their claims with Polanyi's ideas, even when specific texts were under consideration. It may be that in their extended exposition of Polanyi, they rely overly on their chosen two phrases of Polanyi's as interpretive keys to the rest of his work. It may be that their own project distorts their reading of Polanyi. For Gascoigne and Thornton, explicit knowledge is the unquestioned ideal, and the very possibility of tacit knowledge must be justified in view of the ideal, showing it to have a practical content that is articulable in context.

Granted, even though Polanyi is in fact an extraordinarily svelte writer and thinker, there are some words such as "tacit" that exhibit a good deal of slippage. But that Gascoigne and Thornton could have read Grene's important essay, "Tacit Knowing: Grounds for a Revolution in Philosophy," and not clarified this, is puzzling (14, 201). For Polanyi, "tacit knowing" designates all knowing.[1] He is not saying that there is explicit knowledge, and then there is (left over? different?) tacit knowledge. To follow Grene's authoritative articulation, all knowing has a from-to structure. No knowledge is wholly focal; it all has a subsidiary root. The key to Polanyian epistemology is the way subsidiaries relate to the focal, as part to whole, in an intensely dynamic, mutually supportive way.[2]

As an example, stop this minute in your reading and look at this word -- that is, the last word in the text before the dash. This involves you in an awkward disruption of the philosophizing you were doing just before I redirected your focus to the wordage that you had been subsidiarily indwelling. The shift brings to light the subsidiary-focal structure operative in reading. Yes, subsidiary-focal integration requires skill and persons and contexts. But that structure never reduces to them. It also involves responsible commitment -- that's what Polanyi means by personal.

On this understanding, it is not essential to focal knowledge that it be articulated. Nor is it essential to subsidiary knowledge that it could never be articulated. Thus, in view of the former, I can drive you to the airport all the while talking philosophy. In view of the latter, I could teach you how to drive if you needed me to. Thus, "tacit" and "explicit" are not identical to "subsidiary" and "focal." And they do not convey the essential, actively integrative, part-whole dynamic that drives knowing. It is quite common for people to hear the former pair and misrepresent Polanyi. It's much easier to get it correctly if you use the latter pair.

Polanyi could never agree to the very project as it is framed by Gascoigne and Thornton, because they have him backwards. The only "explicit knowledge" is as oxymoronic as a hammer lying on a table rather than in the grip of a master carpenter. What we are supposed to do with explicitly articulated claims is subsidiarily indwell them. That's how, and only how, language becomes meaningful. In contrast to the authors' project, the problem is not that tacit knowledge might not be knowledge. The problem is that explicit knowledge, far from being the ideal, divorced from any subsidiary root, would not be knowledge. So it's not that we need to make "tacit knowledge" somehow presentable in view of an ideal of "explicit knowledge." What's interesting about the subsidiary is not that it is articulable, but precisely that it need not be. The subsidiary can't be and need not be articulated at the point that we are relying on it; that it might be articulated, at another point, is interesting, often helpful, but not the main act of knowing.

Finally, it is important to know that Polanyi indicated not only that we know more than we can tell, but also that we say far more than we know. Whatever we might have in mind by articulated, explicit knowledge says, quite remarkably, more than we thought it did. Not even explicit knowledge is wholly explicit. And that is precisely the never fully specifiable power of articulation.

Polanyi, no doubt, would underscore the concern of Gascoigne and Thornton . Indeed, he himself considered the situation so dire that he left science "to establish an alternative ideal of knowledge, quite generally."[3] He would agree with many of their conclusions: tacit knowing is both ordinary and surprising, but not mysterious. It is communicated in tradition and apprenticeship from master to novice. It involves testimony and assessable standards, and it is not mysterious. The subsidiary can often be articulated. Good judgment requires liberty, even as it can be assessed in view of articulable standards of excellence.

But Polanyi's epistemology -- of knowing as subsidiary-focal integration, the actively responsible human integration of subsidiary clues within a transformative pattern which betokens a profounder reality -- offers more substantial help in their mission than they have been able to tap. The good judgment that Gascoigne and Thornton labor to defend is the essence of Polanyian epistemology.

But if Polanyi is right, hope remains in a world enthralled by codification. Although the ideal is deadening and dehumanizing, detrimental to the cause of expert science and medicine, the fullest codification is always artfully, responsibly, embraced, indwelled and applied, in submission to a responsibly embraced vision of the real. Identifying these often overlooked features and finding ways to be intentional in trusting them will make us all better practitioners, of both medicine and its management.

[1] M. Polanyi, "The Logic of Tacit Inference," M. Grene, ed., Knowing and Being: Essays by Michael Polanyi (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1969)140.

[2] M. Grene, "Tacit Knowing: Grounds for a Revolution in Philosophy," 165.

[3] M. Polanyi, Personal Knowledge, vii.