Taking Action, Saving Lives: Our Duties to Protect Environmental and Public Health

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Kristin Shrader-Frechette, Taking Action, Saving Lives: Our Duties to Protect Environmental and Public Health, Oxford University Press, 2007, 299pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195325461.

Reviewed by Madison Powers, Georgetown University


Kristin Shrader-Frechette is a unique voice in environmental ethics. Her new book, Taking Action, Saving Lives, is a welcome addition to her impressive list of books examining aspects of environmental policy from a richly informed philosophical perspective. This book, however, is a different kind of book from her usual -- or any philosopher's usual -- kind of book on environmental ethics, in that it is, among other things, an explicit call to citizen action in defense against environmental threats to human health.

In order to appreciate the uniqueness of Shrader-Frechette's voice, and of this book more specifically, it is important to locate her body of work within the field.

At the outset, it should be noted that environmental ethics is a comparatively small sub-set within practical ethics. Shrader-Frechette occupies a particularly small niche within that already small area of expertise.

One area of overlap between the concerns of a minority camp within bioethics and those of many who do environmental ethics is the question of whether humans have any moral duties to non-human animals. For the most part, however, environmental ethics focuses on a set of questions that occupies the attention of very few bioethicists. Does the natural world possess any intrinsic moral value independent of its instrumental value for sentient beings? Is biodiversity itself a morally significant matter?

Such questions often proceed to resolution under cover of an overarching question. Does our ethical focus on human welfare, especially human health, represent an unacceptably anthropocentric way of framing questions about the place of humans in nature? These specific questions are not Shrader-Frechette's questions, and the overarching issues they presuppose are not ones that animate her work. Instead, she works on a parallel track. Her concern lies with the relation between risks to human health and attempts to control, manipulate, and remake the natural environment.

In-depth scholarship within environmental ethics that has human health as a central concern is therefore relatively rare.

Public health ethics is perhaps the field having the closest intellectual kinship with Shrader-Frechette's work, but there too there is a considerable difference in emphasis. The bulk of the public health ethics literature concentrates either on the ethics of interference with individual liberty through various public health interventions, or on the distributive justice issues that arise out of public policy priority setting with respect to the promotion and protection of population health. Contributions to human health deficits by way of environmental risk factors are more widely discussed than acted upon within public health practitioner circles, but within the literature of public health ethics, these issues generate little more than footnotes.

There are, nonetheless, very significant overlaps between public health ethics and environmental ethics as Shrader-Frechette approaches the subject. Her sub-title, Our Duties to Protect Environmental and Public Health, reflects her synthetic ambitions for bridging this gap. Public health ethics, like the central practice paradigm of public health itself, is traditionally concerned with disease prevention and control, and of course, more recently with behavioral risk factors that can be addressed through health education or marketplace regulation. But with more than 80,000 chemical compounds in the workplace, the home, and the broader environment, remarkably little in any great detail has been written on these arguably more substantial risk factors, or on the enormous range of ethical issues that are raised by our largely unreflective but ubiquitous alterations of the natural world.

Readers not familiar with the literatures of the various sub-disciplines of practical ethics may marvel that such a gap would exist. How, they might ask, could scholars in this area have failed to map the obvious connections?

There are, of course, many factors that account for what academics choose to study and what they overlook, but the sheer range of expertise and mix of disciplinary competences necessary to map the terrain goes a long way toward explaining why Shrader-Frechette has a unique voice in the field, and why this, and other books by her, are of such great (and I think, overlooked) intellectual importance.

This book offers an accessible primer for anyone who wants to know the kinds of things one needs to know in order to reflect on questions of environmental ethics from a perspective that elevates human health risks to the foreground.

Three main areas of inquiry are covered in this book, although the chapter titles and section headings do not carve up the territory in this precise fashion. An environmental ethicist needs to understand: (i) the legal and regulatory frameworks within which environmental risks are dealt with; (ii) the scientific and economic frameworks within which the various stages of risk analysis proceed; and (iii) possible moral frameworks by which to evaluate risks that are the cumulative product of many intentional and unintentional actors who contribute to the production of harmful results.

Each of the three areas of expertise displayed in this book bears some brief discussion.

The first thing anyone must come to grips with when thinking about the ethics of individuals, governments, and corporations who impose health risks on others is the legal and regulatory context in which these risks exist. There is a vast alphabet of federal and state agencies and international treaties that determine whether harms imposed upon some for the benefit of others is permitted, prohibited, or punished if prohibited. In the US alone we have domestic agencies such as the FDA, EPA, OSHA, CPSA, FTC, OMB, NCI, CDC, and NRC, all of which exercise some degree of overlapping and inconsistent oversight. In addition there is the WTO, NAFTA, and a host of international treaty enforcement mechanisms that determine what risks are acceptable and, indeed, what ordinary citizens might even have a chance of knowing about those risks.

The regulatory authorities cover the air we breathe, the water we drink, the food we eat, the pharmaceuticals and supplements we use, the way we organize transportation and urban development, the fuels that propel vehicles and heat and cool our buildings, the consumer products that stock our shelves and the packaging in which they are wrapped, the chemicals we are exposed to at work, the things that adorn our houses and landscape, and where and how we dispose of the wastes from households and industrial processing facilities.

Environmental health risks arise from the 80,000 chemical compounds in use, but more specifically, they reach us in the form of greenhouse gases, volatile organic compounds, fine-particulate matter, heavy metals, ground water contaminants, ionizing radiation, and in various forms amenable to absorption via skin, nasal passages, or intestinal membrane.

The possible effects that are potential matters of legal regulation include neurotoxicity, developmental toxicity, carcinogenicity, nephrotoxicity, ototoxicity, or teratogenacity.

The law, as it pertains to all of these issues, provides an important component of the grist for the ethicist's mill. The law embodies a set of ethically contentious societal judgments regarding which potential risks merit investigation, which known risks warrant disclosure, which risks are acceptable in light of competing societal and individual ends, and who should bear the burdens of risks for the benefit of whom.

The second body of knowledge essential to doing environmental ethics in the way Shrader-Frechette approaches the subject comprehends an array of systematic disciplines integral to the various stages of risk analysis and assessment.

Risk (or more accurately, hazard) identification involves knowledge of biological mechanisms, epidemiology and statistical methods. Lodged within each are some of the most profound and pervasive ethical issues. Much of moral importance gets lost in sample sizes that are too small to detect or rule out harmful effects, or in the use of theoretical modeling that can hide what more reliable, readily available empirical methods can reveal.

The process of risk estimation similarly involves an evaluative choice among possible outcome measures. Do we look for risk of death per annum, or do we focus on hair loss, vision impairment, or decreased pulmonary function? Do we focus on the probability and magnitude of harm to a reference population of healthy adults, or do we disaggregate the data so that we know more specifically the potential harm to children at potentially lower levels of exposure to some chemical compound?

Then, of course, we have to ask whether the risk, once identified and quantified by some metric, is acceptable. This final stage of risk assessment often relies on methods such as cost-benefit analysis or willingness to pay studies to reach conclusions about what level of resources we should expend to save a life, prevent a cancer, or avert a decrement of respiratory function. Such judgments are heavily value-laden in ways many proponents of formal methods of economic appraisal deny, and their moral usefulness can only be challenged by a detailed understanding of the philosophical foundations of the decision-theoretic assumptions that economists make.

The third and perhaps ultimately most important set of competencies that the environmental ethicist needs to bring to bear requires a framework by which moral responsibility for environmental harms might be evaluated. Given the fact that many independent actors, across a range of social endeavors, including both producers and consumers of environmentally harmful goods, are involved, it is tempting either to suppose that there are a few obvious bad guys -- lax and corrupt government officials and greedy corporate executives -- or else that meaningful talk of moral responsibility must remain elusive.

Shrader-Frechette takes up this issue in chapter 4, and in subsequent chapters she considers a bundle of potential objections to her answer. In a nutshell, her argument is that lack of fine-grained apportionment of responsibility need not be a deal-breaker. Her essential thesis is one that she self-consciously adapts from Thomas Pogge's arguments about what developed nations owe to poor nations. The claim both make is that we need not rest our case in either instance on our ability to marshal arguments on behalf of some indeterminate duties of beneficence or duties of mutual aid. Instead, there are morally more urgent duties not to harm, and these duties are often violated in the very framework of social cooperation by which some benefit only because of the harm imposed on others.

Pogge reflects on the harm done by international trade agreements and other mechanisms of the economic world order. Shrader-Frechette relies on arguments to the effect that all of us who tangibly benefit from industrial and consumer products have some responsibility to ensure that our gain is not realized at the expense of others. There are many examples: the siting of hazardous chemical and disposal facilities in poor neighborhoods, industrial processes that make lots of profits for shareholders but consign workers to painful and early deaths, consumer products brought to market without adequate testing needed to determine potential impact on future generations, climate change, and so on. The list of candidate cases of morally culpable harms is lengthy.

Of course, the plausibility of any particular moral claim will depend on the plausibility of various causal claims. But even if any specific example Shrader-Frechette might find supportable ultimately fails, only the application, not the theory, itself is incriminated.

It is likely that the tone of the author's voice will strike some less adversarial readers as overly insistent and strident at times. They will hear her voice as that of a tireless and tiresome protester when at times rattling off a bullet-point list of environmental health grievances and suggesting the use of civil disobedience as morally appropriate in some instances. Nonetheless, a fair-minded reader has to concede that she has done much to achieve the "primary goal" of the book, i.e., "motivating individuals to accept responsibility for institutional harms to which they contribute and from which they benefit" (p. 13). Even if the overt advocacy is discounted, the perils of private interest science, with all of the flawed methods and blinkered inventorying of health risks, reveals the extent to which all of us have been remarkably complacent about potential hazards of the work we do, the products we use, and the resultant alteration of the planet we inhabit.

Doing environmental ethics in the way Shrader-Frechette does can seem daunting. It requires knowing much about many things. This book is nonetheless the most accessible of her books, and it should pay handsome rewards to any policy maker, citizen activist, or intelligent person with a general curiosity about what a philosopher can add to the conversation that already speaks with a thousand tongues. It might also serve as an invitation to other bioethicists to stick a toe in these waters, especially public health ethicists who have already had to wade their way through the swamps of law, biology, epidemiology, statistics, and the decision-theoretic methodologies of economic theory.