Taking Care of Youth and the Generations

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Bernard Stiegler, Taking Care of Youth and the Generations, Stephen Barker (tr.), Stanford UP, 2010, 238pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 97800804762731.

Reviewed by Peter Gratton, University of San Diego



This book, first published in French in 2008 and provided here in an excellent translation by Stephen Barker, argues that new media technologies, working lock step with speculative capitalism, are generating people unable to attend to themselves and others, and thus be responsible to fellow citizens. Bernard Stiegler’s claim is that the very ability to think is under threat, even if, or precisely because, we haven’t been paying attention.

Best known in the English-speaking world for his Time and Technics trilogy, Stiegler has expanded his thinking to include discussions of political economy, televisual media, the future of Europe, as well as the loss of meaning in the modern world, to cite some of his recent topics. Barker’s translation offers many helpful footnotes for readers orienting themselves within this broader trajectory. It would be impossible to provide a passkey to all his writings. Nevertheless three of his repeated hypotheses are: (a) that technics is not external to the human, and consequently what it is to be human is inexorably linked to (though not determined by) technics broadly understood; (b) that in the name of autonomy, philosophy has suppressed the technical aspect of human being; and © in the contemporary age, we must reconstitute the best aspects of the (European) tradition for supplanting the poisonous aspects of post-industrial or speculative capitalism.

Taking Care reframes the above claims in terms of "the weakness of a society that has become structurally incapable of educating its children" (2). He notes, “the psychic apparatus is continuously reconfigured by technical and technological apparatuses and social apparatuses,” and he argues that modern media technologies far exceed previous forms in not providing for any “maturity” or “attention” in the brain formations of the coming generation (7). We are, he writes, “in the midst of a revolution in cultural and cognitive technologies, and in the very foundations of knowledge,” resulting in a societal “battle for intelligence” (16). This is because the "programming industries" (roughly, the media) aim at usurping our very consciousness by overtaking the "programming institutions" (family, schools, and cultural conventions more generally) that support the proper education of the young.

The main sections of Taking Care provide a case for Enlightenment-era civic virtues along with phenomenological accounts of what it means to attend to different objects. The book then turns to a critique of Foucault’s account of disciplinary power, and his critique of Foucault is essentially Habermasian. Stiegler argues that Foucault treats the early French schools only as “disciplinary,” while “neglecting” the “care” for “generations” taking place through the passing of knowledge necessary for the use of public reason (120-1). The last section of the book critiques the work of Giorgio Agamben, claiming that his view of modern “biopolitics” suggests no way out of the nihilistic politics of the present (160-2).

I will concentrate on the first two-thirds of the text. While Stiegler’s critiques of Agamben and Foucault may be of interest to scholars of both figures, he makes odd claims about both and these will take us away from his central arguments.1 Broken up into eleven parts, Taking Care begins by revisiting the first two paragraphs of Kant’s “What is Enlightenment?” in which Kant aligns mankind’s historical maturity to the individual maturity of those able to cast off “alien guidance” of others. Stiegler claims that such “maturity” (majorité) implies, as Kant’s discussions of practical reason make clear, a responsibility to others as part of an educated citizenry. He accepts and repeats Kant’s claim that “laziness and cowardice are the reasons why so great a proportion of men … gladly remain in lifelong immaturity, and why it is so easy for others to establish themselves as their guardians” (20). His analysis primarily updates this critique for the age of Twitter and Facebook. The new “guardians” are the psychotechnology (i.e. media and marketing) industries, and the middle chapters of the book describe how this “laziness and cowardice” is but a “willful” construction of the programming industries (59). The “cultural industries,” he argues, have a “goal,” which is nothing other than “the elimination of the psychic apparatus through psychotechnologies” — all to have more pliant customers (202).

Despite his critique of Agamben, Stiegler’s depiction of modern media apparatuses is as bleak as anything Agamben has put to paper, and both implausibly map the media landscape as an undifferentiated landmass under centralized control. The modern era follows from an evolution of technics from the age of the book (the “republic of letters”) to televisual culture to a “numeric programming” in the present day that he says is far more dangerous than the last. One presumes this reference to numbers is but a dated allusion to computer coding, and in any case, he’s unclear how this new form of technics, marked by interactivity, is worse than the age of television and movies. Perhaps it’s just that the arc of history bends only one way.

This “battle for intelligence,” Stiegler argues, is the political question confronting us. We no longer educate children, leaving them instead to be babysat by “attention capture” devices. He warns us that our children have “become nothing more than a brain,” having been “stripped not merely of critical consciousness but of consciousness itself” (43). Hence, while we weren’t paying attention, our children stopped paying attention. Children’s programming (a term that he takes in its most nefarious meaning) in the form of France’s TVJ comes in for an extended critique, since it acts to cut children off from an intergenerational “sense of culture and community.” Presumably, this is because children spend time with various technologies and their favorite TV station rather than friends and parents (13). Stiegler writes, "people, having abdicated their majority [majorité, referring both to maturity and democratic majorities] without being conscious of it, ‘give themselves’ to these industries, or rather, the industries capture them as ‘available brain time’" (38).

For those whose attention is waning, Internet consumers that you are, let me cut to the chase: Stiegler is right to attend to the need to reinvigorate “deep attention,” but this work itself shows superficial attention to the myriad issues under discussion. For example, he argues, "the United States suffers … massively from attention deficit disorder," which both sets up much of his analysis and is demonstrably wrong.2 He also cites several times the number of hours of media the average American consumes, and then simply presumes that this results in lowered “attention” spans.3 Following the chain of argument, he then claims that such inattentiveness inexorably leads to rising levels of “juvenile” delinquency. Thus, the future is dim indeed, as I suppose these “incivil,” “restless” masses have their own children, and the script of Mike Judge’s film Idiocracy (2006) plays itself out. Yet rates of such “delinquency” in Western Europe and the United States are down precipitously over the last twenty years (definitional claims aside),4 while at the same time literacy rates continue to go up (not of minor pertinence here),5 just as the threshold has been crossed, according to Stiegler, between televisual technologies (movies and TV) and “numerical” programming (computers, cell phones, etc.).

Perhaps the main victim here of televisual culture is Stiegler himself, who seems to have simply taken for granted media reports about AD/HD, showing little evidence for any research on his own, which I suppose has the upshot of providing an indirect proof for the problem he describes. He rehashes truisms about the rising levels of Attention-Deficit/Hyperactivity Disorder (AD/HD) without noting the vast differences among the many “attention deficit” disorders, or that it involves neurological processes besides those related to temporal retention; nor does he seem to have spent time with sufferers of AD/HD, who would quickly belie a number of his assumptions. He seems not to have thought at all about the historicity of “mental” illnesses and the question of when they could ever be said to arise, not a small point when claiming that AD/HD is wholly contemporary (190). Moreover, Stiegler seems not to have considered that there may be anything other than technological reasons for the rise of AD/HD, not least that we are paying more attention to attention: isn’t this attention paid to attention problems itself a sign that, perhaps, “our” civilization is not wholly inattentive yet? That perhaps our problem, given the amount of drugs dispensed for AD/HD, is precisely because we continue, at all costs, to want to fit children into the disciplinary modes he argues Foucault had wrongly focused on, or simply for the reasons of creating a market, thus literally paying attention? That perhaps, for these reasons, we are paying too much attention to attention, to having our kids and adults sit still and face foreword in the types of classrooms Stiegler argues for? At the least, in a book that admonishes the masses, the “I don’t-give-a-damners,” for not performing Enlightenment self-critique, these questions should be addressed.

What discomfits Stiegler the most, as I take it, are the Internet and gaming cultures, presumably because these forms of play are “individual” and not, on his terms, “individuating” (providing for critical faculties) and social. This is a rather archaic description of both the Internet and video gaming, and by archaic, I am referencing Plato’s classic critique of writing in the Phaedrus. I am not arguing that “deep attention” doesn’t need to be done (I won’t presume, though, it hasn’t been) about how the formation of our very selves is changing in light of these different “attention capture” apparatuses. I am also, as a parent and a philosopher, deeply disturbed by the invidious marketing to children that is inescapable in Western societies, yet garners barely any wider political discussion, despite all that we know about the link, stressed rightly by Stiegler and philosophers going back to Plato, between education widely understood and the future of politics. How can we expect the coming generations to exhibit critical thinking if they are habituated (down to the very shaping of their brains) to respond to marketing imagery? What will count as “intelligence,” Stiegler justly asks, if our communication is coded in and through short SMS messages and there is little respite from various media apparatuses? More pointedly, can we the "majorité" (adults and majority) be really said to be "taking care [prendre soin]" of the next generation, i.e., the generating of humanity as such, given this state of things?

But I stop short when Stiegler argues we are creating a generation of “I-don’t-give-a-damners.” Isn’t this complaint the same as it ever was? Newspapers, mass paperbacks, radio, television, the Internet, and so on, were all going to turn us into a pack of hedonists incapable of doing anything other than making the next purchase. Stiegler repeats these age-old attacks almost verbatim, seeming to have missed an entire era of media studies since Marcuse and Adorno were last seen shaking their fists at the “culture industry.” This is not to suggest that Stiegler is incorrect about the pernicious shaping of human desires — marketers who aren’t creating desires don’t last long. But neither the culture industry nor its consumers are as homogeneous as Stiegler suggests. Heidegger’s analysis of everydayness takes one only so far. To argue that those going online are becoming passive and pacified, all but unconscious beings, is a claim strange to be found in the work of one who writes about the pharmakon (the poison and cure) of writing and then assumes newer technologies could be doing nothing but poisoning the minds of the young.

This brings me to the politics of the book. Since Stiegler is calling for a “reenchanting” of this video-televisual world, just what “enchanted” world is he referencing? On what basis could he begin to presume such masses are not caring, not “giving a damn,” about their lives and the lives of others? The “battle for intelligence,” which he calls “noopolitics,” must be won lest, he says, there be the "liquidation of ‘democratic maturity’ and ‘democratic responsibility,’ that is, populism" (53). If the people aren’t paying attention, he warns, “a few will always think for themselves,” citing Kant approvingly, and these few will be responsible for “spread[ing] the spirit of a rational appreciation for both their own worth and for each person’s calling to think for himself” (40). With rampant “technologies of stupidity,” there is a threat that “it might become literally impossible to (re)educate those organologically conditioned brains that have become prone to incivility and delinquency” (35). Time, he literally argues, is running out (182-3).

What, then, is to be done? Stiegler’s answer is unapologetically a return and reinvigoration of the institutions of the third Republic: bourgeois families (one wonders, though he doesn’t say, who will be caring for all those children no longer attached to their gaming devices), reading-focused schools, and a republican form of government anchored in a united Europe. The “work of forming attention undertaken by the family, the school, the totality of teaching and cultural institutions, and all the apparatuses of ‘spiritual value’ (beginning with academic apparatuses)” will in turn be supported by a new political economy outlined in his other works (184). Failing to demarcate republicanism and democratic theory (he claims Kant as a proponent of the latter6), Stiegler walks haphazardly into the whole problem of political representation. Depicting the “people” as a mass of attention-deficit addled “immature” non-citizens duped by the mass media, incapable of Kantian-style enlightenment and thus unable to govern themselves, he seems not to have considered what or who is to be given such rights of “taking care.” From Plato to Heidegger and beyond, it’s time to attend to another image of the people than as in thrall to Sophistic doxa and media imagery. In other words, isn’t there something strange about a book that talks about “caring for the youth” that robs those very youth of any autonomy, of any thought, as Stiegler defines those terms? Taking Care is notably silent on just what they/we think of the changes being wrought during their/our lifetime; don’t worry, he suggests, they’ll take care of you.

Finally, it is more than striking that Stiegler has not paused before arguing for a renewed European culture while generously citing Jules Ferry regarding civilizational “maturity” and “social primary identification.” Surely this deserves attention. Ferry’s legacy was not simply secular public schools, but also an impassioned imperialism guided by his claim that it was the French “duty to civilize the inferior races.” This “republican” education system — praising universal rights, as long as one was “French” — was itself a “psychotechnology” and “programming industry” transmitting a generational “superego” described well by generations of anti-colonial writers. One can argue for a renewed republicanism set afloat from its colonial history — arguing, say, Kant’s Critique of Practical Reason is not contaminated by his Anthropology — but privileging “systems of care,” a renewed Europe, and a “battle for intelligence” as a “process” of “unification,” which, he writes, “in Jules Ferry’s time [was] called ‘the nation,’” while discussing the masses in the same coded language of nineteenth century racialists (“lazy,” non-thinking, immature, etc.) is ominous (61).

The point is not to dismiss Stiegler’s approach, but to show attention to the deep issues it raises. We do not, “live in what amounts to nothing more than a desert of nihilism” (120), and if we do, then perhaps we ought to take care of one thing: quickly passing the torch to the coming generation, who may have better things to say about how we can take care of ourselves and generate change than returning to old Europe.

1 Foucault, he argues, thought of power wholly in terms of the state and is said to have ignored economic issues, despite the publication of his 1978-9 lectures, collected as Birth of Biopolitics, prior to this book (120), while Agamben is read on the basis of his short What is an Apparatus?, all but ignoring key texts where he takes up issues Stiegler says he neglects.

2 Any statistics on mental health are notoriously question-begging, but U.S. government statistics show that 4.1% of adults (with similar figures for children) suffer from AD/HD, far less than “massive” and far less than prominent disorders such as depression and various mood disorders.

3 Stiegler, for example, cites the work of Katherine Hayles, but elides her ambiguous take on such new technologies. He does the same with the two studies he cites on AD/HD and the media, moving from the tentative conjectures of their authors to a definitive, final claim about these new technologies causing AD/HD. The article on which Stiegler relies is available online.

4 Stiegler cites only a rise in delinquency from 2005 to 2006, but of course, the “long term,” as he calls it, is more important, since as far as we can tell, no sudden mass adaptation of new media occurred during that year. For fuller statistics for the United States, see http://bjs.ojp.usdoj.gov/.

5 See, for example, this UNESCO table on the notable rise in literacy, both in the West, and the rest of the world, during the period when cell phones, the Internet, and other forms of media discussed by Stiegler were introduced.

6 At several key points, Stiegler refers to Kant and the French republican Jules Ferry in terms of “democratic process[es],” — despite Kant’s well-known warning in “Perpetual Peace” “not to confuse the republican constitution with the democratic (as is commonly done)” — obviating a discussion of the problem of representation that his own approach to “taking care” of generations would engender.