Taking Confucian Ethics Seriously: Contemporary Theories and Applications

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Kam-por Yu, Julia Tao, and Philip J. Ivanhoe (eds.), Taking Confucian Ethics Seriously: Contemporary Theories and Applications, SUNY Press, 2010, 225pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438433158.

Reviewed by Stephen C. Angle, Wesleyan University


The philosophical world is changing. By fits and starts, non-Western traditions are beginning to be taken seriously as philosophy. This is not just a feature of Anglophone philosophical discourse. As recently as 2008, John Makeham described Sinophone scholarship on Confucianism as lacking philosophical creativity.[1] The Spring of 2011, in contrast, will see the first issue of a Chinese journal devoted exclusively to the contemporary philosophical development of Confucianism (Research on Contemporary Confucianism, edited by Huang Yushun), and there are other signs that Confucianism may once again become a vibrant tradition capable of self-criticism and growth. A critical aspect of this vibrancy is the openness of Confucian philosophers to stimuli of all kinds from outside the tradition. The book that is here under review represents an equally important flip-side to these Sinophone developments: Professors Yu, Tao, and Ivanhoe ask us, Anglophone philosophers, to see what good can come from taking Confucian ethics seriously. These goods are, for the most part, to be measured from within the discourses of contemporary Western thought: by taking Confucian ethics seriously, the book's readers will be learning new things on subjects they already care about, or perhaps experience a broadening of their sense of what matters in moral, political, or other areas of philosophy. At the same time, insofar as projects like the present book are successful, we may find the category of "Western philosophy" increasingly irrelevant. Philosophy will probably remain highly pluralist, but on both sides of the Pacific it promises to be less firmly unified by pre-existing linguistic-cultural traditions.

This is an exciting future, but its plausibility depends on whether projects like the present book actually work. Is it, in fact, fruitful for Anglophone philosophers to take Confucian ethics seriously? Must great violence be done to the works of the Chinese masters in order to make them relevant to "contemporary theories and applications"? Happily, I find that the essays collected in the volume collectively represent a significant step forward toward a future in which Confucian ethics is indeed taken seriously, and they make this case through detailed and focused argument on a range of specific topics. In the balance of the review, I will discuss each essay briefly, then conclude with consideration of a theme that emerges across many of the essays: the relation between Confucian ethics and Western moral theories (especially Kantianism and virtue ethics).

Heiner Roetz's opening essay is the only one in the volume that focuses primarily on methodology. He argues for an approach to the Chinese texts based upon an ethical "eye-level principle" (15) of striving to come to an understanding with the author -- to express respect for the author -- rather than adopting a more objective, distant, scientific approach. Roetz wants us to engage in dialogue with the Chinese texts and their authors, i.e., to take seriously their truth claims and be ready both to criticize and learn. He explains that the authors of the texts in question were themselves concerned with "public reasoning": they were addressing a significant audience and doing so with ("exceptions notwithstanding") arguments (22). With two caveats, I find myself in agreement with Roetz. One hesitation concerns the details of his analysis of the analogical reasoning found in texts like Mengzi (Mencius) and Han Feizi. I find Roetz's reading to be a bit flat-footed, attributing flawed (from our perspective) reasoning when a better alternative is available. "Respect" seems to demand that we make the texts out to be as plausible as possible, subject to other interpretive constraints.[2] Second, Roetz's analysis is consistent with the observation that the various authors or authorial groups responsible for the texts were interested in other goals in addition to -- and perhaps with priority over -- public justification.

"The Handling of Multiple Values in Confucian Ethics" is Kam-por Yu's fascinating analysis of what he calls "a line of thinking" within Confucian ethics. Yu builds his analysis around the notion of zhongyong, especially as found in the first half of the text by that name (commonly translated "Doctrine of the Mean"), but he clearly believes that this approach to moral reasoning is widespread in early Confucianism. In any event, the pluralist approach to reasoning that he explicates is significant both for the ways it helps us understand various Confucian texts, and -- more importantly from the perspective of the volume's explicit goal -- for its fruitfulness as a contemporary approach to ethical thinking and practice. Yu argues both that the general model of striving to balance or harmonize multiple values is important (indeed, superior to single-value theories) and that the Confucian texts shed important light on how to deliberate well in the face of multiple values (see esp. 43-6).

In the volume's third essay, Qianfan Zhang argues that there is a key difference between the way that the central value of ren is realized by early Confucians in ethical as versus political contexts. Zhang maintains that as an ethical ideal, ren should be understood as "humanity" in the Kantian sense of respecting human dignity, but ren-politics has the more limited sense of "benevolence" in government. In other words, Zhang sees an inconsistency in the ways that ren is understood in the two different spheres, which he attributes to negative assumptions about the common people's moral and intellectual capacities. His goal is to expose the weaknesses of the "benevolent" approach to politics and argue for a reconstructed Confucianism that takes ren-as-humanity seriously in politics as well as ethics. I agree with Zhang that there is a tension in early Confucian writings roughly along the lines that he sketches, though my own development of this theme differs from Zhang in two ways.[3] First, I believe that Zhang significantly overstates the resonances between ren (as an ethical virtue) and Kantian ethics; I will say a bit more on this near the end of the review. Second, and relatedly, Zhang is too sanguine about the prospects for finding a "demand for implementing and adhering to a list of basic rights and freedoms" in ren. Nonetheless, I applaud his effort to take Confucianism seriously by challenging us to think creatively about Confucianism's future.

Chun-chieh Huang's contribution to the volume is similar to Zhang's in that it identifies an on-going challenge to Confucianism that has not yet been adequately resolved. The challenge, too, is similar: Huang says that Confucians must find a better way to "ease the conflict between human beings as ethical agents and human beings as political agents" (92). His analysis of this problem focuses on the concepts of "gong" and "si," which he translates as "public" and "private," and he illustrates the problem in two ways. First, Huang enumerates various conflicts between putatively private values (like filial devotion) and public ones (like loyalty to the state or ruler). Second, he argues that efforts to solve these dilemmas have foundered in part because politically powerful actors simply conflate their own private interest with allegedly public concerns. Huang does not offer us much by way of a solution, though he at least hints that democratic politics might make it easier to resist conflation of gong and si. My main reaction to Huang's historically rich essay is to suggest that Yu's notion of balancing multiple values may be relevant to how at least some Confucians would have approached Huang's dilemmas and, in any event, offers a resource for contemporary Confucians. In fact I think that Huang's main case (a conflict of values from Mengzi 7A35) is intended by Mengzi to express precisely the kind of balancing that Yu discusses.[4] For some Confucians, to be sure, gong and si were understood in the dichotomous terms that Huang uses. In general, though, I believe we find one field of values rather than two distinct realms, with relatively personal (si) concerns on one side and more general (gong) concerns on the other.

Julia Tao's "Trust Within Democracy" is the third essay in a row to focus significantly on the relations between ethical and political values. She sketches two contemporary Western views concerning whether trust is essential to successful governance, from Hardin and from Uslaner, and then proposes to enrich the latter's positive answer with additional resources from Confucianism: Tao says that Confucianism can fill a lacuna in Uslaner's account by offering a philosophical justification for the necessity of trust. The key to this justification is the idea that trust as a virtue -- applicable to familial, civic, and political contexts -- is critical to providing the best environment for humans to thrive (108). Interestingly, Tao offers a much more robust reading of "benevolent (ren) government" than Zhang, arguing that its final goal is "aiding the people to develop their moral character and to achieve their full humanity" and, furthermore, that for this to happen (which includes the development of both familial and civic trust), rulers must "honor the political virtue of trust by instituting fair laws, clear rules, and the practice of [benevolent] government" (115). I am afraid that this section of the essay moved too quickly for me to find it completely convincing, either as a balanced reading of the relevant texts (in addition to material cited by Zhang, what about the well-known Confucian concern about laws and regulations?) or as a philosophical answer to the question of how moral values relate to political values and institutions. Still, I do agree with Tao about the final goal of Confucian politics, and so it may be that a persuasive case can yet be made for seeing trust and the other virtues as central to flourishing familial, civic, and political lives.

Let me now turn to two essays that deal explicitly with contemporary virtue ethics: Shirong Luo's defense of a "ren-based" interpretation of Confucian ethics and Eirik Harris's exploration of the nature of virtues. Both are responding to prominent contributions to contemporary Western virtue ethics: Luo's touchstone is Michael Slote's idea of agent-based ethics, and Harris is reacting to the idea that virtues are "correctives," as argued in a famous paper by Philippa Foot.[5] Agent-basing is a strong form of virtue ethics, according to which the value of good actions is directly and exclusively derived from admirable qualities of the agent. Luo's argument is two-fold: first, that we should understand early Confucian texts as advocating a specific kind of agent-basing (namely, ren-basing); and second, that several challenges to the possibility of ren-basing are mistaken. In particular, Luo aims to rebut D.C. Lau's prominent view, according to which "no moral system can be solely based on moral virtues" (129). The specifics of Luo's detailed argument against Lau (and his quicker dismissals of other alternatives to ­ren-basing) are beyond our scope here, but suffice to say that I find them quite successful. This means that Luo has provided us with a firmer case for the plausibility of agent-based virtue ethics and made headway against at least one version of the criticism that virtue ethics is necessarily "incomplete."[6]

Harris sees much that is attractive about Foot's contention that virtues are fundamentally distinguished by being "correctives" but argues on several grounds that this cannot, ultimately, be the best way to understand the nature of virtues. He suggests that we would still think of a sage as being virtuous, even if the sage suffered from no temptations and thus was in no need of correction. He also has a nice argument to the effect that: (1) self-love is an important, if implicit, Confucian virtue; and (2) the importance of self-love is not that it is corrective. He shows convincingly that for Mengzi, one must have "a certain conception of the self as having ethical potential if one is to be able to even engage in the moral life" (170); this is what Harris means by self-love. He ends with the claim that we can find in Confucian texts a distinctive type of "inclinational" virtue that has little to do with correction. I found this to be less convincing. Harris seems to slide back and forth between speaking of certain basic reactions (the four duan of passage 2A:6 in Mengzi) and the full-blown virtues (of ren, etc.) to which Mengzi also refers in the passage. Ultimately, though, there is enough here to put the tie between virtue and corrective into serious question.

Unlike virtually all the other contributions, Justin Tiwald draws on a markedly post-classical Confucian thinker, the eighteenth-century giant Dai Zhen, to develop his account of a "non-naïve" version of "sympathetic understanding" and its role in ethical deliberation. Sympathetic understanding (shu) has a place in the theories of most Confucian ethicists of any period, but Tiwald argues both that its exact meaning and role changes and that it is particularly central for Dai. Furthermore, Dai's version contains insights from which contemporary philosophers can learn. The core idea is that for Dai, shu does not just mean to put oneself in someone else's shoes, but to do so in a way that has built-in to it a concern for both one's own and the other's humanity. The very motivation to reflect on another's good through one's own eyes comes (at least in part) from one's felt attachment to the value of human "life fulfillment," which helps Dai and Tiwald gain a needed critical distance from the mere fulfillment of occurrent desires. Tiwald's account is sophisticated and based on a very careful reading of Dai's texts. It is sometimes a bit difficult to tell whether all of Tiwald's precise distinctions truly have a grounding in Dai, but even if we were to conclude that Tiwald is operating as a Confucian philosopher "in the spirit of Dai's project" (148) at least as much as he is operating as an interpreter, this would not detract at all from the degree to which he is taking Dai's Confucian ethics seriously -- and giving us a reason to do so, as well.

The volume's last essay is "The Values of Spontaneity" by Philip Ivanhoe. The essay's goal is subtle. Neither a direct interpretation of a given text nor a direct engagement with a current controversy, it seeks instead to draw out of a range of early texts two "ideal types" of spontaneity, to show why they are valuable, and thereby to suggest that philosophers today should think about these values. By retrieving (and reconstructing, insofar as these are ideal types) these twin notions of spontaneity and displaying their value, Ivanhoe seeks to nudge Western philosophers to broaden or shift their ethics. This is a nice example of the goods that can come from taking Confucian (and, in this case, Daoist) ethics seriously. As a supplement, let me note a type of value for spontaneity that Ivanhoe does not discuss: what we can think of as its instrumental value in ethical practice. In addition to valuing spontaneity for the reasons Ivanhoe canvasses, Confucians were impressed with the ease and reliability of spontaneous ethical responses, which thus provides another kind of reason to aim at spontaneity. On this score, some Western philosophers have made related observations, e.g., when it is observed that moral exemplars tend to find it easy, automatic, or necessary to make moral choices with which others of us would struggle.[7] Even here, I suspect that there is more that contemporary philosophers have to learn from the Confucians.

All of the volume's essays agree that it is valuable to take Confucian ethics seriously. I have noted a few disagreements above: Zhang and Tao offer different assessments of what ren-government has meant, though their recommendations for what it should mean in the future are much closer; we can also see some difference of opinion between Yu and Huang over whether Confucians should adopt balancing or dichotomous approaches to handling value conflicts. The deepest divide, though, may be over the relation between Confucian ethics and competing contemporary Western approaches to ethics. Roughly, is Confucianism more similar to Kantianism or to virtue ethics?[8] Zhang and Tao both stress ideas like the equal humanity, moral worth, or human dignity of all. Huang says that the ways in which value conflicts were determined shows a priority for deontological ethics over utilitarian ethics (80), and Yu suggests that Confucian ethics have both deontological and teleological levels, with the picture looking something like Kant's schema of perfect and imperfect duties (45-6). On the other hand, as discussed above, Luo argues explicitly that Confucian ethics is a strong kind of virtue ethics, and Harris largely adopts this framework as well, even though he notes that such a reading of Confucianism "is not universally accepted" (177, n. 2).

If we were to step outside the bounds of the present volume, we would observe three general views. One group, mostly made up of Chinese scholars writing in Chinese, many of them influenced by the great twentieth-century Confucian philosopher Mou Zongsan (1909-1995), find the parallels between Confucianism and Kantianism to be striking and central. A second group, mostly made up of scholars in the U.S. writing in English, sees Confucianism as encompassing one or more forms of virtue ethics. A third group, comprising both Chinese and Western scholars and much less unified than either of the other two groups, tends to see Confucian ethics as sui generis and fitting poorly into any existing Western classifications. At the same time, scholars both East and West have already been pointing out that talk of rules, respect, and even deontological constraints need not bring with it the whole Kantian framework and can even fit within a virtue ethics. Others have been making the point that having an important place for virtues and character is not, on its own, sufficient to qualify a theory as a virtue ethic. I believe that one result of taking Confucian ethics seriously -- by which I mean both this excellent book and the reactions it is sure to inspire -- will be to help us clarify what is at stake between these various approaches to ethics and then help us move forward constructively toward a pluralist and open future in which philosophers versed in a variety of traditions are ready to challenge and learn from one another.

[1] John Makeham, Lost Soul: "Confucianism" in Contemporary Chinese Academic Discourse. Cambridge: Harvard University Asia Center, 2008.

[2] For an alternative reading of the reasoning in Mencius 6A, see Bryan Van Norden, Virtue Ethics and Consequentialism in Early Chinese Philosophy. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2007, pp. 278-301.

[3] For my own argument, see Stephen C. Angle, "Rethinking Confucian Authority and Rejecting Confucian Authoritarianism." Chinese Philosophy and Culture 8 (2010): pp. 27-56.

[4] See my discussion in Stephen C. Angle, Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009, pp. 100-101.

[5] See Michael Slote, Morals from Motives. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001; and Philipa Foot, "Virtues and Vices," in Virtues and Vices and Other Essays in Moral Philosophy. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1978.

[6] Many authors discuss the alleged incompleteness of virtue ethics; see, for example, Robert Johnson, "Virtue and Right." Ethics 113 (2003): pp. 810-34.

[7] See, for instance, Iris Murdoch, "The Idea of Perfection." In The Sovereignty of the Good. New York: Routledge, 1970, pp. 1-45; and Philip Hallie, Lest Innocent Blood Be Shed: The Story of the Village of Le Chambon and How Goodness Happened There. New York: Harper and Row, 1979.

[8] The present volume's authors do not consider Confucianism's relation to consequentialism, aside from Huang's brief statement rejecting its relevance to his topic (80); for a stimulating effort in this direction, see Manyul Im, "Mencius as Consequentialist," in Chris Fraser, Dan Robins, and Timothy O'Leary, eds., Ethics in Early China (Hong Kong: Chinese University of Hong Kong Press, 2011).