Taking Life: Three Theories on the Ethics of Killing

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Torbjörn Tännsjö, Taking Life: Three Theories on the Ethics of Killing, Oxford University Press, 2015, 309pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190225582.

Reviewed by Charlotte A. Newey, Cardiff University


The punchy central claim of Torbjörn Tännsjö's book is that act-utilitarianism best explains our considered intuitions about the moral status of different kinds of killing. An interesting aspect of this book is Tännsjö's revisionary methodology, which he names 'Applied Ethics (Turned Upside Down)'. So, why does Tännsjö choose applied ethics (turned upside down) to argue for act-utilitarianism's role in explaining our considered intuitions about killing and what, exactly, is his innovative method of moral investigation?

Tännsjö establishes a new methodology for ethical enquiry because he is wary of attempts to (p. xi) 'establish moral principles through swift and abstract arguments.' his scepticism towards using abstract arguments to establish true moral principles concerns the move from theoretical to practical ethics. He claims 'It is not possible to show that a moral principle is true in the abstract. Moral principles always surprise us in concrete application.' It therefore seems as if Tännsjö aims to establish which, if any, moral principle is true. For example, he suggests (p. xi-xii) 'We do not know whether a comprehensible true moral theory exists in the first place; however, only if we resort to the method I advocate will we be able to unravel it -- if indeed it does exist.' Similarly, when Tännsjö writes (p. 5), 'If we want to take the content of an intuition as evidence for a moral theory, the intuition must not be the result of a conscious inference from the theory put to the test' he appears to seek evidence for the truth of a theory overall. In the end, however, Tännsjö takes care not to claim that 'utilitarianism is true' (p. 294).

Tännsjö's project is ostensibly limited to setting up a competition among rival moral theories to see which best withstands practical application to end-of-life decisions and which best explains why we should or should not take a life in particular cases. In this regard, he will claim act-utilitarianism wins and rival theories fail. Even so, the claim that (p. 5), 'The principle that gives the best explanation of the content of our moral intuition gets inductive support by this content' suggests the book's conclusion will play a part in a larger project of demonstrating that act-utilitarianism is the true theory.

In chapter 1, 'Method', we are told that applied ethics (turned upside down) is a novel way of approaching a range of well-known ethical problems, thought experiments and dilemmas. Traditionally, practical ethics takes a top-down approach. We take a moral principle, say Kant's Categorical Imperative, and apply it to a real or imaginary case to determine the permissibility of an act or to discover a moral requirement or prohibition. As one might expect, the 'turned upside down' part of Tännsjö's methodology advocates a bottom-up approach. We start with intuitions about what is permissible, required or prohibited in a particular case, real or imagined, and -- with some work -- the content of these intuitions may become evidence for the truth or falsity of a moral theory. Much more needs to be said.

Tännsjö's bottom-up method relies in part on empirical data from surveys of 1000 randomly selected participants in China, Russia and the United States into public opinion concerning cases of killing. These are trolley cases, murder, capital punishment, suicide, assisted death, abortion, survival lotteries, killing in war and the killing of animals, with a chapter being devoted to each case. In addition to its appeal to empirical data, the bottom-up approach also depends on Tännsjö's 'considered' intuitions. We move from immediate, unreflective intuition -- reactions to the surveys, for example -- by subjecting our reactions to 'cognitive psychotherapy'. This involves considering the sources of our intuitions. We should discard intuitions stemming from faulty reasoning, implicit biases or cultural biases. Crucially, we must recognise when an apparent intuition is actually a deduction from our favoured moral theory since we cannot use such deductions in order to test the very same theory.

Intractable beliefs -- those that survive cognitive psychotherapy -- become our 'considered intuitions', the content of which, holds Tännsjö, can be used as potentially fallible but generally reliable evidence in our moral thinking (pp. 4-16). This is an attractive aspect of his methodology, since the notion that cognitive biases distort a range of judgments, including moral judgments, is starting to yield important philosophical research, and yet is all too often ignored.

The competition that Tännsjö sets up runs like this: in each chapter, he reports results from the survey question pertinent to that topic. Different responses among the three countries suggest that a cultural bias exists. If so we must consider that our own intuitions about the case might be influenced by that bias and take care to rise above it (this presupposes that we can rise above these biases). Tännsjö also gives his own considered intuition about the cases. Next, he applies the top-down approach to establish the implication of each of his chosen moral theories. If a theory's implications cohere with Tännsjö's considered intuitions, and with his reasons for having the intuitions that he has, he takes this as evidence in favour of the truth of that theory. If not, that counts as evidence against it.

Although there is only one survey question for each theory, Tännsjö asks further questions in each chapter. He says (p. 157), 'I do not think that any simple argument . . . can settle the relative merits of competing moral theories. We have to try out their implications in many different situations, and see whether the implications are plausible or not.' I say more about the method when I discuss chapter three, in which Tännsjö tests out his theories against trolley cases.

In the second chapter, Three Bold Conjectures, Tännsjö selects moral theories to test against our intuitions about the ethics of killing, restricting the number of theories eligible for potential justification to just three. The three chosen theories -- deontology (understood as either the Kantian humanity formula or as the Sanctity of Life Doctrine), rights theories (understood in the Nozickian sense) and act-utilitarianism -- cover a sizeable area of moral terrain and they offer useful contrasts to each other when applied to real or imagined cases. While the chosen theories may be suitable for testing against both immediate and considered moral intuitions, they are not sufficient for Tännsjö's ultimate claim that an outright winner emerges as the best explanation of our moral intuitions about killing. The reason for this is simply that the winner is only a winner among those three. Tännsjö's reasons for rejecting other popular and plausible moral theories from his investigation are too brief. If offering the best explanation earns inductive support for the truth of act-utilitarianism, Tännsjö owes us solid justification for excluding other plausible moral theories.

Let us consider some other plausible contenders. If the content of our considered intuitions can be evidence for the truth or falsity of moral principles, we should expect a full discussion of moral particularism, the view that moral judgments do not depend on moral principles at all. Tännsjö's dismissal of particularism is painfully brief (p. 284): 'we should not vest any belief in particularism until we have done our best to find a true moral principle, and failed. We are not there yet.'

Tännsjö states that demonstrating that act-utilitarianism best explains intuitions about killing will be a step towards showing that particularism is wrong (p. 17). If Tännsjö does demonstrate this unequivocally, it will be some justification for eliminating particularism from his bottom-up methodology. However Taking Life provides no further justification for the early rejection of particularism, though a footnote directs us to Tännsjö's "Applied Ethics. A Defence." Here, Tännsjö's main criticism is of Jonathan Dancy's justification of moral knowledge in Moral Reasons.

On Dancy's view, particularism is a metaphysical view about ways in which actions get to be right and wrong, rather than an epistemic view about moral knowledge. True, Dancy thinks that once the metaphysics is in place, the moral epistemology is unproblematic. Chapter 8 of Ethics without Principles, 'Knowing Reasons', offers a rich epistemic story. Dancy relies on the notion of a competent judge -- someone who recognises differences when she comes across them. The ability to recognise is a sophisticated skill that we learn as we grow up. Tännsjö is sceptical that such knowledge can get off the ground, which is odd given his comment about killing (pp. 70-71) 'Even if we cannot tell why this is so, we have no reason to distrust our judgement about the particular cases'. His bottom-up approach should certainly consider the possibility that general principles are at best otiose. Without further argument, Taking Life cannot assume that some general moral theory must be superior to particularism.

Tännsjö also dismisses Rossian pluralism, Scanlonian contractualism, virtue ethics and rule consequentialism. Some of these, such as virtue ethics, are dismissed because they are unsuitable for Tännsjö's methodology; '[virtue ethics] gives us no superior account of right-making characteristics of action' (p. 92). On a popular understanding, virtue ethics does not offer practical guidance but again he owes us more than a sentence. For example, Rosalind Hursthouse argues that virtue ethics is no less action guiding than standard consequentialist and deontological theories;[1] two theories that Tännsjö includes in his investigation. That a theory does not fit his method may be a problem with the method, not with the theory.

Tännsjö says that rule-utilitarianism: 'cannot state any plausible answer to the question of what it is that makes an action wrong . . . . We have distanced ourselves too much from the patient, the agent, and what really took place in the situation.' Again, this is a complaint that the rule-utilitarian approach to determining moral requirement is unsuitable for Tännsjö's method. This is not his only reason for rejecting rule-utilitarianism. Indeed, he says rule-utilitarianism is 'highly implausible' (p. 46) but, beyond a footnote reference to Brad Hooker's (2000) Ideal Code, Real World, he ignores the most sophisticated versions of rule-consequentialism. Tännsjö's explanation of how act-utilitarians make decisions is largely rule-utilitarian in shape. Moreover, his concern that act-utilitarians teach certain rules to their children (p. 102) looks very similar to Hooker's 'internalization by the overwhelming majority of everyone, everywhere, in each new generation' (2000: 80). Tännsjö does not address the familiar objection that act-utilitarianism collapses into rule-utilitarianism, and vice versa.

Tännsjö admits to sidestepping some methodological concerns, saying (p. 54) 'If I had had space enough, and my readers had had patience enough, I would have gone deeper into them'. This reader has patience enough and there is certainly space enough for a more robust justification of this stage of Tännsjö's method. As it stands, Tännsjö can at best claim to have found a winner from the three.

Chapter 3, The Trolley Cases, provides the most detailed application of Tännsjö's method. Tännsjö claims that abstract trolley problems are least affected by cultural bias, citing evidence from Marc Hauser, Fiery Cushman et al (2007). However, Natalie Gold, Andrew M. Colman and Briony D. Pulford criticise the 2007 study for sampling only WEIRD (western, educated, industrialised, rich, democratic) countries; their own research reveals differences in responses between WEIRD countries and China. This same disparity shows up in Tännsjö's surveys. Without explanation, Tännsjö sets the results from China to one side, while maintaining that even if there are some reasons to doubt our immediate responses to these cases, cultural idiosyncrasies are not among them. This inconsistency is important. If our immediate responses stem from our cultural background, they fall at the first cognitive psychotherapy hurdle. Purely for the sake of illustrating Tännsjö's method, I note this limitation but follow his argument.

The first case is Switch, Jarvis Thompson's famous trolley problem, followed by two variants (Footbridge and Loop). Tännsjö notes the majority views (subject to my caveat above) that emerge from reactions to these cases: we should flip the switch in the original version, we should not push the big man off the bridge and we should flip the switch in loop. Tännsjö's own immediate responses concur with the majority view in Switch and Loop but not in Bridge. How do deontology, rights theory and act-utilitarianism fare in relation to the majority view? Each theory seems to contradict at least one of the widely held intuitions about trolley cases.

Very briefly, Tännsjö reasons that in Switch, rights theory forbids us to flip the switch because doing so actively violates a right to life without permission. The Sanctity of Life Doctrine permits flipping the switch based upon the Doctrine of Double Effect and the Principle of Proportionality, while the Kantian Humanity Formula permits flipping the switch because we do not use the single person as a means to rescuing the five. Act-utilitarianism requires us to flip the switch because doing so maximises utility. Tännsjö's intuition passes cognitive psychotherapy because he identifies its source as 'sympathy and simple math'. A point each for deontology and act-utilitarianism and a point against rights theory.

Footbridge is more interesting. The majority view from each country is against pushing the big man off the bridge. Tännsjö's intuition is in favour of doing so, since he sees no morally relevant difference between Footbridge and Switch. Act-utilitarianism requires pushing the big man to maximise utility. The Humanity Formula supports the majority view not to use the big man solely as a means to an end. The Sanctity of Life Doctrine may permit pushing him, depending on the Doctrine of Double Effect. Again, rights theory forbids the active violation of a right to life.

Tännsjö argues that the immediate intuitions of the majority in his surveys will not survive cognitive psychotherapy, offering an evolutionary debunking argument to explain why those surveyed are reluctant to exercise personal force against the big man in Footbridge (pp. 67-73). The content of considered intuitions, those intuitions that survive the process of cognitive psychotherapy, can be used as evidence. But once the source of the intuitions of the majority has been revealed, the content of these intuitions provides no evidence in favour of deontology and rights theories. However, Tännsjö also demonstrates convincingly that in Footbridge he has gained his intuition from the very theories he seeks to justify. As such, (p. 78) 'a sound debunking strategy has robbed us of all possible evidence.'

In Loop, there is weaker support from the majority (Russia and the US) for flipping the switch. Tännsjö's own intuition to flip the switch survives cognitive psychotherapy, once again stemming from empathy and math. Of the three moral theories, only act-utilitarianism aligns with his considered intuitions. This is a point in favour of act-utilitarianism and against the other two theories.

Each of the following eight chapters follows the same method for a particular case of killing and I will not summarise each chapter, since the final one, 'What Are We to Believe?' clearly summarises the findings of the previous nine, reminding the reader of problems encountered along the way. At the cost of abandoning a personal 'considered' intuition that conflicted with act-utilitarianism, Tännsjö declares act-utilitarianism the winner. I simply note my concerns with Tännsjö's method. First, there is the ad hoc instruction to ignore the cultural differences in Chapter 3. Next, his survey only reports findings from a maximum of two questions per dilemma, whereas he adapts and refines his questions testing the theories only against his own intuitions. The refining is a point in favour but readers may question whether Tännsjö's intuitions and method are theory driven in places. Another concern is that there may be other cognitive biases at play. Since most of us are raised as meat eaters, the status quo bias -- when people prefer things to stay the same by doing nothing or by adhering to a decision made previously -- could affect our intuitions about the moral permissibility of eating meat. The same bias might also be present in the intuitions Tännsjö presents in Chapter 10, 'Killing in War'.

That said there are several appealing aspects of Taking Life. The first is Tännsjö's discussion of possible interpretations of rights theory and deontology in Chapter 2. There are numerous ways of presenting these theories and, while some may disagree with his interpretation, Tännsjö clearly details the salient aspects of each theory. He provides interesting discussions of topics such as the Doctrine of Double Effect, the Principle of Proportionality, together with a useful introduction to Just War Theory. The concise explanation of each dilemma and the practical application of the three theories repeatedly throughout the book appeals, since many students struggle to apply theories to cases and the rigorous repeated application of the three theories could be very instructive. I also enjoyed rethinking familiar ethical dilemmas from a different perspective, even if I did not agree with all of Tännsjö's conclusions.


Dancy, Jonathan, Ethics without Principles, 2004, Oxford University Press.

Gold, N., Colman, A., and Pulford, B. (2014). Cultural differences in responses to real-life and hypothetical trolley problems. Judgment and Decision Making, 9(1), 65-76.

Hooker, Brad, Ideal Code, Real World, 2000, Oxford University Press.

Hursthouse, Rosalind, 'Normative Virtue Ethics', in R. Crisp (ed.), How Should One Live?, 1996, Oxford University Press.

Samuelson, W., and Zeckhauser, R. J. (1988). Status quo bias in decision making. Journal of Risk and Uncertainty, 1, 7-59.

Tännsjö, Torbjörn, 'Applied Ethics. A Defence.', 2011, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice.

[1] 'Normative Virtue Ethics', in R. Crisp (ed.), How Should One Live?.