Taking the Measure of Autonomy: A Four-Dimensional Theory of Self-Governance

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Suzy Killmister, Taking the Measure of Autonomy: A Four-Dimensional Theory of Self-Governance, Routledge, 2017, 200pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138700123.

Reviewed by Benjamin Mitchell-Yellin, Sam Houston State University


This ambitious book cuts against the grain. Killmister lays out a framework for thinking about autonomy that eschews the received view in many quarters. Difficulty reconciling the various uses to which "autonomy" is put has led to calls for a moratorium on our use of the term. Killmister demurs. Good for her. Her view centers on the idea that there are several dimensions to autonomy, and while they are related, one may fall short in one but not the others. The result is a nuanced theory of autonomy that illuminates how the concept applies in a range of domains and to a range of agents.

Killmister puts a wealth of cases to good use. This is especially helpful given that she begins with a barrage of distinctions, and the pace keeps up for some time. (By my count, we get 15 distinctions by the bottom of page 7!) It would've been nice for this reader to have a sense of what is at stake, aside from the fact that, despite it not being "a term we often hear in everyday conversation," autonomy names something "people are already implicitly tracking" (1). Sure enough, we do recoil from paternalist interventions in our lives and judge each other in "autonomy-related" ways. This helps to explain why we want a theory that yields the correct verdicts in a range of cases and illuminates connections with closely related concepts. If we didn't think autonomy mattered, there'd be no need for such a fuss.

And yet, so far as I see, Killmister simply assumes that we are right about this. She doesn't elaborate on autonomy's importance to us or argue that we are correct to care about it. This is a shame. Interrogating the notion that autonomy matters can help to shed light on how we should think about the concept. This is a point I'll return to. But first I want to say something about Killmister's four-dimensional theory and its virtues.

Though I have complained about the number of distinctions and the speed with which they come at you, at the end of the day, they pay off. Killmister analyzes autonomy along four interrelated, yet distinct dimensions. The first three flesh out the 'self' of self-governance and concern what she labels local autonomy. The first, self-definition, concerns the various attitudes that bring with them "agential commitments." Given that one values x or believes y or has z as a goal, there is something that one ought to do or be. These attitudes provide normative standards; one's values, beliefs, and goals may be more or less coherent. And the more coherent one's self-defining attitudes, the more autonomous one is along this first dimension.

While self-definition is about the agent's identity, the second dimension, self-realisation, is about her agency. It concerns the commitments one takes on in virtue of deliberating in the service of forming intentions (internal self-realisation), as well as the commitments one takes on in virtue of intending in the service of acting (external self-realisation). Killmister helpfully points out that there are various ways of falling short of the standards set by these commitments -- for example, one might akratically intend what one recognizes as the worse option or fail to do as one intends due to a false belief.

The third dimension of autonomy, self-unification, has to do with integrating the previous two. Do one's intentions and actions uphold the commitments that stem from one's beliefs, values, and goals? Does one alter one's identity in the ways one intends to? Here, Killmister's is a no-priority view: one can autonomously resolve cases of conflict -- for example, intending to do something that goes against one's values -- either by altering the intention or altering the values. I'm not convinced. This aspect of the view appears to rely on a conception of intentions on which they may be authoritatively formed independently of the agent's values. I don't think that's correct. But it's noteworthy because it's emblematic of a general tendency in Killmister's thought. She focuses on the structure of autonomy, not its substance. And so she avoids taking a stand on issues regarding how exactly to fill in the framework she so carefully lays out. Shortly, I'll say a bit more about why I think this general tendency is mistaken.

The fourth dimension, self-constitution, concerns "the extent to which an agent is in the business of taking on commitments" as opposed to upholding them (69). This dimension captures global autonomy and sets a minimum threshold for being autonomous -- that is, for being the kind of agent for whom paternalism, consent, moral responsibility, and distinctive forms of respect are an issue. There are three requirements: (1) the agent must have some values, beliefs, or goals; (2) the agent must be willing and able to seriously deliberate and act; and (3) the agent must be able to unify her attitudes and exercises of agency. Interestingly, Killmister argues that one can fall short of one of these requirements while satisfying the others. Thus, meeting the minimum threshold is not a simple all-or-nothing affair. Moreover, this dimension admits of degrees and localized failures. Someone whose self-defining attitudes are wider in scope is more autonomous along the dimension of self-constitution than one whose self-defining attitudes are narrower in scope, and bouts of severe pain may temporarily disrupt one's willingness to deliberate, rendering one less globally autonomous for some time. These added nuances are welcome.

And they are not confined to the fourth dimension of autonomy alone. One of the main attractions of Killmister's view is that it allows for nuanced analysis of a wide range of cases. For example, her view yields the interesting conclusion that the "contented slave" and "deferential wife" are both highly locally autonomous, and yet they suffer from a deficit of global autonomy. Thus, her view is able to illuminate the "double bind" hemming such agents in: they can only increase their global autonomy at the expense of reducing their local autonomy, and vice versa. The view also yields interesting insights about the ways in which oppression diminishes autonomy and the ways in which interventions may serve to enhance it. Here Killmister should be applauded for attending to questions about the autonomy of disabled persons, who often don't get the attention they deserve.

Yet, as Killmister readily admits, her view is not able to give us all we want. In her discussion of manipulation cases, she argues that even though her view cannot secure the intuitively correct conclusion that thoroughly manipulated agents are non-autonomous, this isn't a real problem because rival theories can't either. She correctly notes that it's an open move, in seeking reflective equilibrium, to bite the bullet and claim that there are cases for which we should throw out our intuitions. But I don't think this is necessary here (for her or her rivals).

Killmister considers and rejects a familiar response to the problem of manipulation. We might invoke a historical condition on the acquisition of relevant attitudes. Roughly, in order to factor into autonomy assessments, agential commitment-engendering attitudes must be acquired in ways that do not bypass the agent's own agential capacities. A value permanently and unwittingly implanted via hypnosis that conflicted with the agent's other values wouldn't render her set of self-defining attitudes incoherent and so diminish her level of autonomy along the dimension of self-definition. On this strategy, violation of the historical condition renders the relevant attitude external. Killmister rejects this move because it "casts its net too wide, ruling out much of early childhood education, including education directed at developing capacities that are themselves necessary for autonomy" (116).

But there is a second response to the problem of manipulation that is not subject to this same worry. Rather than applying the historical condition to determine whether or not an attitude of a certain type is internal, we might apply the historical condition to determine whether or not an attitude is of the relevant type to begin with. Consider T. M. Scanlon's notion of a judgment-sensitive attitude.[1] Part of being this kind of attitude, say, a belief or a value, is that possession of it involves a web of dispositions that are sensitive to judgments about reasons. This opens up space for historical considerations to play a role in determining whether or not a given mental state is a judgment-sensitive attitude. If having a given disposition requires exhibiting it, and if exhibiting that disposition requires certain things over time, then we have a historical condition on a psychological state being of a certain type. For example, supposing that part of what it is to value something is to be disposed to affectively track its welfare in line with one's judgments about its worth, and supposing that possession of this disposition requires affective tracking over some period of time, then the attitude of valuing is essentially historical. One could not be hypnotized to have a certain orientation towards something and instantly be said to value it. This orientation would have to play out in certain ways over time for this to be the case. And so rather than saying that historical considerations in part determine whether the attitude of valuing is internal to an agent, we can say that historical considerations in part determine whether an agent's orientation toward something counts as valuing it.

Early childhood education may serve to instill various tendencies, including to affectively track the welfare of certain things one judges valuable, but this wouldn't amount to valuing those things until the relevant tendencies had played out over time in the right ways. And once they have, it seems plausible to say that the agent really does value these things. Thus, this second solution seems to avoid the objection to the first. Moreover, it appears wholly compatible with Killmister's account of autonomy. She studiously avoids taking a stand on the nature of the attitudes that engender agential commitments. But perhaps she should stick her neck out in places. Adopting the requirement that only judgment-sensitive attitudes, understood in this essentially historical sense, engender agential commitments would appear to allow her view to capture our intuitions about the autonomy of thoroughly manipulated agents. (It would, so far as I can see, also be available to proponents of some rival theories, and this is one reason why I disagree with her that they cannot properly account for manipulation cases.)

There is another tricky case that raises a different worry for Killmister's view. She considers an agent who lacks a commitment not to abandon her beliefs, values, or goals without good reason. "Such an agent would be able to abandon any attitude at will, without that conflicting with any of her commitments; she would then seem to be unbound in just the way I have suggested is incompatible with autonomy" (30). We can alter Killmister's case slightly to posit an agent who, in addition to abandoning all self-defining attitudes, also abandons deliberation and intention formation. At the limit, such an agent might come to lack any agential commitments because she has, in the pursuit of lack of conflict, shed all attitudes that engender them. She simply goes with the flow, as it were, and has no agential commitments of any kind. According to Killmister, such an agent would not "damage" her autonomy along the dimension of self-definition -- and self-realisation and self-unification, in our modified case -- because she would not have any conflicting commitments. And this because she would not have any agential commitments to conflict. However, she goes on to add that this does not entail that this agent is "highly" autonomous, "because she would exhibit a very low level of self-constitution" (30). "An individual is not governing herself -- she is not autonomous -- if she simply fails to take on any commitments" (69). Thus, the present case appears to present us with an agent who, in the quest to not be non-autonomous along the three local dimensions, ends up being non-autonomous along the global one.

I have two questions about this case. The first is whether we need to appeal to diminished self-constitution to get the conclusion that this agent is non-autonomous. Killmister appears to hold that one is highly autonomous along the local dimensions if one does not have conflicting agential commitments. She seems to suggest that an empty set of agential commitment-engendering attitudes renders one highly autonomous along the dimension of self-definition because one lacks conflicting agential commitments. Otherwise, she wouldn't need to appeal to self-constitution to secure the conclusion that such an agent is non-autonomous. But I would've thought that autonomy along the local dimensions requires not just the lack of conflict, but also the presence of commitments. Mere lack of conflict does not seem enough to secure autonomy. It requires actual coherence, not mere non-incoherence. Killmister appears to think otherwise, but I fail to see why.

My second question about this case has to do with why this agent (or anyone else) should care that she is non-autonomous. Killmister has presented us with a case of an agent who fails to be autonomous because she fails to take on any agential commitments. So what? If this agent has no agential commitments, then, for that reason, she doesn't have an agential commitment to being autonomous. And insofar as she is non-autonomous, she is in the same boat as any number of non-human creatures. They (and we) don't care that they are non-autonomous. What's different about the agent in this case?

One response would be to claim that there is some other reason, not stemming from her agential commitments, for this agent to care about being autonomous. It seems clear that Killmister doesn't think there are any unsheddable agential commitments. But she does appear to think that autonomy is conceptually bound up with various things we evidently care about, such as moral responsibility and respect. Perhaps we can generate an argument that this agent should care about not being autonomous from the premise that she cares about these other things (or that we should care about her being non-autonomous because we care about these other things). But this just pushes the problem back a step. It's not clear why this agent (or we) should care about her not being morally responsible or being disrespected in relevant ways. There are plenty of creatures we recognize as non-autonomous, and yet we don't think that they (or we) have reasons to care about their not being responsible or being disrespected in relevant ways. Maybe, however, the analogy doesn't work. After all, this agent has the capacity to be autonomous, whereas these other creatures (presumably) don't.

I am intrigued by the idea that our capacity to be autonomous in some way grounds a commitment to being autonomous. Perhaps it's a rational or moral commitment, as opposed to an agential one. I don't know. It's difficult to make out the argument for this claim. That doesn't mean we shouldn't try. Indeed, those of us who agree with Killmister that we shouldn't abandon talk of autonomy should want something to say here. Many philosophers seem persuaded that talk of autonomy can be helpfully replaced by talk of the various other concepts that autonomy is supposed to be bound up with. Forget autonomy and focus, instead, on moral responsibility, respect, etc. on their own terms. It would help to counter this line of thought if we had something to say about our commitment to the importance of autonomy itself.

Killmister's book helpfully lays out a framework for thinking about autonomy, and one of its real virtues is that it helps us to see the many ways that autonomy is bound up with other things we care about, both in the agential and political spheres. But that is not enough to stave off the prevailing headwinds. There is a sense in which the case of the agent who gave up her status as autonomous is a stand-in for the philosopher who gave up her interest in the concept of autonomy. Puzzling out what to say about the former's mistake seems a nice way of puzzling out what to say about the latter's.

[1] T. M. Scanlon, What We Owe to Each Other, Harvard University Press, 1998, esp. pp. 20-22.