Taking Utilitarianism Seriously

Placeholder book cover

Christopher Woodard, Taking Utilitarianism Seriously, Oxford University Press, 2019, 244pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732624.

Reviewed by Paul Hurley, Claremont McKenna College


Christopher Woodard sets himself a difficult task here. Utilitarian theories are a subset of consequentialist theories, but even many of Woodard's fellow consequentialists take themselves to have compelling reasons to reject certain commitments distinctive of utilitarian forms of consequentialism. They have outgrown utilitarianism, and have developed arguments for distinctively non-utilitarian forms of consequentialism that are grounded in deep features of prevailing accounts of attitudes and actions. If so many consequentialists no longer take utilitarianism to be a plausible form of consequentialism, and take themselves to have good reasons for focusing on other, less problematic forms, why should those of us who find consequentialism itself problematic take utilitarianism seriously?

Woodard's strategy, against both his consequentialist and non-consequentialist critics, is to argue first that the fundamental commitments of utilitarian consequentialism, considered in isolation, are not themselves implausible individually or collectively, and second that the main challenges to its plausibility involve "one version or other of the idea that it is too simple." (85) Woodard seems to allow that the most simple and straightforward version of utilitarianism, act utilitarianism, is susceptible to many of these objections. But he argues that a distinctive version of utilitarianism, one that augments act-based reasons with pattern-based reasons, does have the complexity and nuance to preserve the theory's initial plausibility in the face of these challenges, hence does deserve to be taken seriously. I have learned a great deal through engaging with Woodard's arguments in this book; it is an important new contribution to debates concerning utilitarianism, and consequentialism more generally. The book delivers a spirited and often ingenious defense of one particular strain of utilitarianism, a defense that is at once refreshingly candid about the significant difficulties that must be faced, and audacious in its proposals for overcoming them.

In what follows I first summarize Woodard's account of the defining features of distinctively utilitarian consequentialism, then canvas the six objections to utilitarianism that he takes up. Next, I discuss the aggressive ground clearing work that he undertakes in his characterization of utilitarianism before summarizing his own preferred version of utilitarian consequentialism. His case for this preferred version is by implication an argument that other consequentialists have perhaps been too quick to abandon the distinctive features of an act utilitarian theory of value, retaining only its act consequentialist structure. The more promising course, he argues, is to jettison any limitation to the "act" dimension of the consequentialist structure while maintaining the distinctively utilitarian theory of value. I will sketch his argument that the resulting form of utilitarianism, utilitarian in its theory of value but not act consequentialist in its structure, does have the resources to address the complexity of our ethical convictions while retaining the initial plausibility of the central elements of utilitarianism. I suggest along the way that Woodard builds a highly specific account of the relationship between reasons and right action into (typical) utilitarianism generally and into his version in particular, and close by suggesting an alternative interpretation of the traditional objections under which his version of utilitarianism might well be more rather than less susceptible to them.

Woodard identifies three central elements of utilitarianism: consequentialism ("we can explain . . . the rightness of actions . . . in terms of the goodness of outcomes" [4]), welfarism ("all well-being has noninstrumental value, and nothing else has noninstrumental value" [5]), and sum-ranking ("the value of an outcome is the sum of the good . . . existing in that outcome" [5]). Act utilitarians are committed to a particular form of consequentialism, act consequentialism, according to which "an act is right if and only if, and because, its outcome would be at least as good as . . . any relevant alternative." (4)

Woodard suggests that the six objections to utilitarianism he considers all boil down to allegations that the theory is too simple to account for our ethical convictions. The objections are that utilitarianism has a crass and simplistic theory of value; permits abhorrent actions; is too demanding; fails to take seriously the separateness of persons; cannot account for our intuitions about political philosophy, intuitions about justice, legitimacy, democracy, and publicity; and presupposes an impoverished human psychology. He recognizes the apparent force of all of these objections, and suggests at various points that standard act utilitarianism is hard pressed to provide the nuance and complexity to meet them. The question then is whether there is a form of utilitarianism for which no one of these objections taken by itself is clearly fatal.

Woodard answers by developing a version of the theory that he believes can provide the sophistication and nuance necessary to deflect the force of each of the six objections. He argues that this preferred theory can afford to be agnostic concerning subjective and objective theories of well-being. It adopts non-perspectival accounts of both reasons and rightness, upon which our reasons are the reasons we in fact have, reflecting what in fact promotes everyone's benefits and minimizes harms; but it eschews non-perspectival accounts of deliberation and praising/blaming, opting for a "simple divorce" (54) between the former pair and the latter pair. Most notably, his version recognizes reasons of two different kinds: 'direct' act-based reasons of the sort recognized by traditional act utilitarians, and distinct pattern-based reasons. Others, Woodard argues, recognize non-act-based reasons of various sorts, e.g., rule-based and motive-based reasons. But it is the recognition of distinctive pattern-based reasons that allows utilitarianism to develop the complexity necessary to accommodate our deep ethical convictions about what morality permits and requires, about the separateness of persons, and about the distinctive nature of claims of justice.

I will proceed shortly to develop and explore in greater detail the most distinctive element of Woodard's account, his appeal to pattern-based reasons. But it is important first to highlight certain refinements of Woodard's characterization of utilitarianism itself beyond his three core elements. Although these three central elements, consequentialism, welfarism, and sum-ranking, do seem to provide an innocuous characterization of utilitarianism, his refinements do not. For example, he asserts, almost in passing, that utilitarianism as he understands it is incompatible with internalism about reasons, including all Humean theories of reasons. Yet if I am a typical economic utilitarian, I take myself to have reasons to maximize the satisfaction of my preferences, i.e., to promote my own well-being, and take the right action or policy to be the one that maximizes overall well-being. I am a Humean about reasons, but a utilitarian about rightness. I satisfy Woodard's three core elements of utilitarianism, but qua Humean I am not, Woodard suggests, really a utilitarian. Again, the early Peter Singer is an avowed Humean about reasons[1] who satisfies Woodard's three core elements, but seemingly fails to pass muster as a utilitarian. Clearly an additional, more divisive element is being added to the very characterization of what it means to be a utilitarian.

In a similar vein, Woodard asserts that standard forms of act utilitarianism are committed to the claims "that agents ought always to bring about the best possible outcome and have the most reasons to do so," (29) that "rightness is a function of reasons," (56) and in particular that "we should operate . . . with an unrestricted concept of rightness, which is a function of all the reasons for action there are," (57) and that "utilitarians are quite likely to think," (56) with him, that all reasons are explained fundamentally in terms of aggregate, agent-neutral well-being. Each of these commitments leaves some avowed utilitarians on the outside looking in; indeed, Woodard allows that Sidgwick and Mill might themselves be outliers here. Clearly, Woodard augments his innocuous characterization of the core elements of utilitarianism with robust views of the nature of reasons and the relationship between reasons and rightness, views that many traditional and contemporary utilitarians do not share. In particular, he yokes the fate of utilitarianism to versions upon which all reasons are fundamentally grounded in appeals to distinctively agent-neutral well-being.

With this somewhat brutal refinement of utilitarianism in place, Woodard proceeds to articulate his own preferred form of the theory. Recall the set up. The objections, he claims, are each that utilitarianism is in some way too simplistic, and he takes these objections to have considerable traction against act utilitarianism. A standard response is to retain act utilitarianism, and reject sum-ranking and welfarism. Woodard takes the path less traveled, retaining the utilitarian theory of value but modifying the act consequentialist theory of reasons. The act utilitarian maintains that all moral reasons for action are in his terminology action-based. The indirect utilitarian maintains that all moral reasons are, in Woodard's terminology, rule, motive, or pattern-based. He maintains that although some reasons for action are based directly in the agent-neutral evaluation of actions, others are based indirectly in the agent-neutral evaluation of the patterns of which such actions are parts. He thus provides a hybrid account: there are both act-based and pattern-based reasons for action, and one and the same action can have both action-based and pattern-based reasons for or against performing it. Act utilitarianism is thus half right but also half wrong, and it is this second half, he argues, that makes all of the difference in facilitating effective responses to the six objections.

What, then, are these pattern-based reasons, and how do they allow utilitarianism to address the six objections more effectively? The idea is that actions can be parts of broader patterns of action. If the pattern is itself good, "the goodness of the pattern is the putative basis of the reasons to perform the part." (91) These are reasons to perform actions that are not reasons to promote the best outcomes. Agents thus can have pattern-based reasons to perform actions that are parts of a good pattern, reasons that can potentially weigh against act-based reasons to promote the best outcomes.

Which patterns are the basis of reasons? Minimally, a pattern would seem to be "any arbitrary combination of token actions." (97) Clearly, some such patterns will not even be performable. Others can only be good given some form of idealizing assumption, e.g., that everyone plays their part in the pattern. Woodard rejects such patterns as 'ineligible,' opting for a 'willingness' requirement on the patterns that are eligible as a basis for reasons to do one's part. This constraint holds that there are only pattern-based reasons for S to do his part in some pattern P "if the other agents required to realize P would cooperate in doing so, were S to do X." (99) This is a strong constraint on eligible patterns, but it still seems to fall prey to standard objections to rule utilitarianism. Say that a pattern of promise keeping is good, but that I have an act-based reason in some case to break my promise. Does the good pattern provide me with a reason to keep my promise even though breaking it will promote the best outcome? It would seem not. As Woodard recognizes, there would appear to be an alternative eligible pattern which consists of everyone else keeping their promises while I break mine. Ex hypothesi, this is a better pattern, hence a collapse of pattern-based into action-based reasons threatens.

Here Woodard notes that although the alternative is a better pattern in the sense described, and hence should seemingly give rise to a pattern-based reason to break a promise, the resulting pattern is not a pattern in the ordinary sense that is more akin to a practice. Perhaps, he suggests, only "those patterns which constitute practices are eligible." (110) But why? If the alternative pattern satisfies willingness and is better, why eliminate it in favor of the worse practice-constituting pattern? Woodard acknowledges the problem: "we have not offered any rationale for the restriction to practices, other than that it is a way of avoiding the conclusion that there is an act-based reason to do X whenever there is a pattern-based reason to do X." (110)

Assuming that we can surmount these challenges to pattern-based reasons, Woodard suggests that the augmentation of a utilitarian account of act-based reasons with pattern-based reasons allows for plausible responses to all six of the objections. Such pattern-based reasons, although based in the appeal to agent-neutral goodness, give rise to agent-relative reasons for each agent to do her part. Such reasons can ground constraints on abhorrent actions, temper the demandingness of act utilitarianism, vindicate appeals to moral rights, and harness such moral rights to carve out accounts of justice, political legitimacy, and democracy that accord better with our ethical convictions, accounts that are not available to the act utilitarian. We should take utilitarianism seriously, then, because even though the six objections that it is irremediably simplistic have considerable traction against act utilitarianism, Woodard's hybrid act-based/pattern-based alternative has the nuance and sophistication to brunt their force.

The aforementioned summary does not begin to do justice to the richness of the view. I close, however, by raising two very different kinds of worries about Woodard's central arguments. The first focuses more narrowly on the prospects for his own particular hybrid account: does it solve the problems of each hybridized component, or inherit the problems of both? The second focuses more broadly upon his characterization the most powerful objections to utilitarianism.

Among the myriad difficulties with standard forms of rule and motive utilitarianism, at the forefront are worries about the collapse of rule-based standards into action-based standards and about the 'eligibility' of rules to provide standards for rightness. Both of these kinds of worries can seem only to be heightened with the pattern-based approach. Woodard's 'willingness' constraint seems inadequate to prevent a threatened collapse of pattern-based reasons into act-based reasons. With such a collapse, his proposal would be no more effective at avoiding the six objections than act utilitarianism is. Woodard acknowledges that his proposed solution, unpacking eligible patterns in terms of existing practices, seems ad hoc. We very well may each have reasons to do our fair share in supporting good practices, but he has provided no pattern-based rationale for doing so. He optimistically suggests that the absence of any such rationale sets "an agenda for further development of the theory," (111) but it is not clear why it does not indicate the prima facie inadequacy of the theory. Another distinctive challenge is that the hybrid account must provide some way to judge the relative strength of pattern-based and act-based reasons. Woodard does "not see any special difficulty here," (191) but if, for example, pattern-based and act-based reasons are best understood as largely incommensurable, then many of the purported advantages of this version of the theory are lost.

The second worry cuts deeper, questioning Woodard's assertion that all of the objections to utilitarianism are basically charges that it is too simple. Consider instead a very different understanding of these and related objections suggested by Bernard Williams, upon which the theory is not accused of being too simple, but too complex, requiring one thought too many (not too few). Forms of utilitarianism such as Woodard's, Williams argues, must presuppose what our ethical convictions seem to confirm, that any non-vacuous determination of well-being must recognize that agents have fundamentally agent-relative reasons flowing from their plans, projects, and commitments.[2] Yet these utilitarians also assert that all reasons are fundamentally agent-neutral. The result is absurd complexity and the dis-integration of the individual agent. The simple relationship between a man's actions and his projects is rendered incoherent by such an account due to its schizophrenic complexity, not due to its simplicity.[3] Although the theory presupposes what our ethical convictions confirm, that both our reasons and our reasoning -- our deliberation and decision-making -- have fundamentally agent-relative elements, it is driven by its commitment to the fundamental agent-neutrality of all reasons to a simple divorce of agent-relative deliberation and decision-making from reason. To accommodate ethical convictions, however, such a view must then generate a simulacrum of the fundamentally agent-relative reasons and deliberation that it at once both presupposes and rejects. Framed within Williams' understanding of the relevant objections, Woodard's divorce is not 'simple', but spectacularly complex and messy. Indeed, on this very different understanding of the roots of the demandingness, separateness of persons, integrity, abhorrent actions, and implausible psychology objections, the additional complexity introduced by Woodard's version of utilitarianism does not alleviate concerns about simplicity, but rather further exacerbates concerns about implausible, irremediable complexity.

Other utilitarians, many of whom Woodard identifies as atypical, mitigate the problem thus understood by recognizing fundamentally agent-relative reasons. Other consequentialists reject the utilitarian theory of value in large part because it cannot adequately accommodate fundamentally agent-relative values, reasons, and reasoning. On such an alternative interpretation of the objections, it is such alternative versions of utilitarianism, and of consequentialism more generally, that are better positioned to address them, hence that have a better claim to be taken seriously.

[1] See, for example, Practical Ethics, p, 207.

[2] See, for example, pp. 110-11 of Williams' contribution to Utilitarianism: For and Against (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1973).

[3] These allegations of absurdity, dis-integration ("in the most literal sense, an attack on his integrity"), and incoherence appear in Utilitarianism: For and Against, pp. 116, 117, and 110 respectively.