Taking Wittgenstein at His Word: A Textual Study

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Robert J. Fogelin, Taking Wittgenstein at His Word: A Textual Study, Princeton UP, 2009, 181pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691142531.

Reviewed by Anat Biletzki, Tel Aviv University



This is a superb book. It takes Wittgenstein at his word, seriously acknowledging that his strictures on how to do philosophy cohere with how he did philosophy. If, as is usually adumbrated, Wittgenstein enjoined us, as philosophers, not to formulate philosophical theses but rather to unearth the linguistic misunderstandings that give rise to philosophical troubles, then consistency demands that his own philosophical writings were not a roster of theses — with attendant explanations, arguments, justifications, and elaborations — but a working out of that same methodologically constrained program. Fogelin, accordingly, identifies the essential elements of such philosophical manners and illustrates their application in a textual reading of Wittgenstein’s words on two quintessential Wittgensteinian issues: rule-following/private language and the philosophy of mathematics.

It seems that we are constantly inundated with Wittgensteinian interpretation. Every year tens of books are published on Wittgenstein or on ascribable Wittgensteinian themes. However, one can distinguish between publications that use Wittgenstein to further philosophical agendas beyond pure interpretation and those that focus on interpretation alone. That is to say, Wittgenstein and Wittgensteinianism are seen — legitimately, though sometimes exceedingly — as offering an intellectual perspective that can provide interesting or novel insights into linguistic, aesthetic, cultural, moral, and even political questions. These works do, indeed must, rely on particular interpretations of Wittgenstein’s texts, but their objective is not the interpretation of Wittgenstein per se. That endeavor, of achieving an understanding of Wittgenstein through an exclusively interpretative enterprise, is the one that is at the fore of our current interest. Here we are witness to a diverse panoply of interpretative policies and strategies. Some are very text-oriented; others address Wittgenstein through contextual frameworks. Some alight on one of several (the Early, Late, Middle, Third) Wittgensteins; others prefer a more general, or, at the least, developmental object of interpretation. Some engage with the diverse interpretative community; others insist on independent readings. Some attempt to unearth the secrets and mysteries hiding behind Wittgenstein’s formulations; others are more explicitly literal. Some have an ideology, a not-so-hidden agenda of changing the landscape of interpretation (see “The New Wittgenstein”); others continue the “standard,” perhaps no less ideological, traditional project of Wittgensteinian interpretation. And some take Wittgenstein at his word.

Who has ever taken Wittgenstein at his word? And how? And what does it mean to take Wittgenstein at his word? As Fogelin reminds us, there have been prominent Wittgensteinian interpreters who have understood Wittgenstein’s demands clearly — that a philosopher must not amass theses but should rather clear up misunderstandings of language through description alone — but have, while interpreting him, disagreed with such stipulations. Two ways of disagreement can subsequently be recognized. One can, while in the interpretative mode, understand Wittgenstein’s methodological strictures but claim, as an interpreter of Wittgenstein, that he himself did not obey them (as does Crispin Wright, Wittgenstein on the Foundations of Mathematics, Duckworth, 1980). Or one can, while still in the interpretative mode, go a more convoluted route and argue — i.e., disagree — with the restrictions, assess that Wittgenstein himself is faithful to them, but nonetheless attempt to expose real philosophical truths in his writing (as does Michael Dummett, The Logical Basis of Metaphysics, Harvard UP, 1991). These interpreters have understood him, but have not taken him at his word.

In his “The ‘Middle Wittgenstein’: from Logical Atomism to Practical Holism” (Synthese 87, 1991), David Stern, startlingly, seems to present us with a similar complication. He says: “I think it should be clear by now that we ought to take Wittgenstein’s rejection of philosophical theorizing, his lifelong conviction that philosophy is ‘not a theory but an activity’ seriously, even if we don’t ultimately take him at his word.” What would it mean to take Wittgenstein’s philosophical methodology seriously and still not take him at his word … ultimately? Is Stern saying that although we “believe” Wittgenstein’s intentions, although we are convinced that he believed not only in his instructions for the philosopher but in his own fidelity to them, we are nevertheless permitted to continue in our traditional, standard way of interpretation and look for philosophical positions and theses (not just descriptions) in his work? If so, then we are not, ultimately, taking him at his word.

Almost eerily, a recent book (Duncan Richter, Wittgenstein at his Word, Continuum, 2003), presents a related yet dissimilar ideology that is invested in doing Wittgensteinian interpretation. Taking Wittgenstein at his word means, for Richter, focusing on the therapeutic goals that Wittgenstein claims for (his) philosophy, and he goes on to uncover such therapy in several Wittgensteinian stations (including the less beaten, but absolutely appropriate, paths of ethics and religion). One would have thought that Fogelin is bent on the same project, for he heralds his work with its central question:

What kind of interpretation emerges if we adhere strictly to Wittgenstein’s methodological pronouncements, in particular, his claims that his aim is purely therapeutic and that he is not in the business of presenting and defending philosophical theses? (p. xi)

But, I hasten to add, therapy as the definitive end of the philosophical method that he is soon to process drops out of the picture right then and there. (I submit that therapy does not again appear in the book; it is definitely not one of its index entries.) Instead of continuing to focus on therapy, Fogelin takes Wittgenstein at his word by performing two fundamental exercises: he reads Wittgenstein as applying said methodology (of describing the use of language in order to dismantle deep-seated misunderstandings) to two Wittgensteinian themes; and he does so in Wittgenstein’s words, by “assembling reminders,” so to speak, i.e., by the precise technique that Wittgenstein requires for doing philosophy.

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Devoting the first of two parts of the book to the Wittgensteinian mantras “to follow a rule” and “private language,” Fogelin takes us, yet again, into the familiar sections of Philosophical Investigations, §183-§315. Almost endearingly, he (a) gives credit to all past readings of these themes that have intuited, mostly wrong-headedly, the basic problematics of both subjects; and (b) harks back to both his own previous reading of the issues and Saul Kripke’s “”SpellE">skeptical" paradox and solution, skirting the now-unimportant contest of priority between them, and repudiating both.

In chapter 1, the fulcrum of the rule-following discussion is Wittgenstein’s recognition of the problem of interpretation as the central predicament in following a rule:

This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule. … It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here from the mere fact that in the course of our argument we give one interpretation after another; as if each one contented us at least for a moment, until we thought of yet another standing behind it (PI 201).

Wittgenstein uses the proposed methodology of description to solve the problem: “What this shows is that there is a way of grasping a rule which is not an interpretation, but which is exhibited in what we call ‘obeying the rule’ and ‘going against it’ in actual cases” (PI 201). The essential trait of following a rule is that we follow it de facto. So essential is it that Fogelin creates a new, somewhat less than articulate, term — defactoism — to conveniently label his and, most importantly, Wittgenstein’s solution. The label needn’t be defined but is rather a typically Wittgensteinian amalgam: we undergo training in our community as part of our natural history, training is dependent on our natural human responses, rules that we are trained to follow are a function of our society, and there is no intermediary (mental or other) third-man between expressions and their applications. That is to say, the solution to the problem lies in recognizing a curious mix of communitarianism and naturalism. Furthermore, and still in typically Wittgensteinian ambience, rule-following is ineffable and rules are mundane. (This has the added value of hinting at illuminating contrasts between the early and late Wittgenstein: mundane rules are distinct from sublime logic and a strict insistence on consistency gives way to a more tolerant approach later.)

The second chapter, still in Part I, houses the move to a treatment of the private language issue (obviously not the private language argument), which follows naturally upon the rule-following deliberations but is nevertheless unanticipated. Arguing with his own earlier reading again, Fogelin maintains that grammatical reflections on rule-following and more precisely the recognition of the grammar — i.e., the rules of use — of private rule-following lead to a drastically different question about private language than the one investigated in traditional readings. Our inquiry no longer revolves around the possibility of a private language but is rather about its imaginability. When we make out the grammar of first-person reports of sensations we realize that the very idea of “private language” is incoherent — so one cannot even ask of its existence or non-existence.

Where is the “at his word”? My own two paragraphs above have reported on Fogelin’s words; Fogelin has reported on Wittgenstein’s words. Reportage is almost all there is to it, albeit with inevitable explicatory accompaniments. Fogelin takes us through Wittgenstein’s words, proving, so to speak, that “the paradox of interpretation is … a recurrent and central feature throughout Wittgenstein’s later philosophy” (p. 19). From the early Philosophical Grammar he recruits the tantalizing passage:

If someone asks me ‘What time is it?’ there is no inner process of laborious interpretation; I simply react to what I see and hear. If someone whips out a knife at me, I do not say ‘I interpret that as a threat’ (PG I 9).

Appreciating this kind of philosophical minimalism, in both doing philosophy and reading Wittgenstein aright, leads indeed to the posit of defactoism, which is closely aligned with the ineffability of rule-following. Again, Fogelin, speaking for Wittgenstein, uses Wittgenstein:

To what extent can the function of a rule be described? Someone who is master of none, I can only train. But how can I explain the nature of a rule to myself? . . . Our disease is one of wanting to explain (Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics VI 31).

The methodology continues to serve him throughout his presentation up to an extreme, but anticipated conclusion. Lest we succumb to ascribing to Wittgenstein a closing, bottom-line thesis - not the consensual, traditional impossibility of private language, but even its newly exposed incoherence - Fogelin delivers the coup de grace in, or actually out of, Wittgenstein’s words:

[Could we] imagine a language [where] the individual words of this language are to refer to what can only be known to the person speaking; to his immediate private sensations? So another person cannot understand the language (PI 243).

Although we might intuitively say yes, although we have all been primed, in the Wittgensteinian context, to say no, Wittgenstein does not give an answer as to the imaginability of a private language, precisely because grammar does not allow one.

Part II evinces the same methodological policy. Wittgenstein’s thoughts, nay — words, on mathematics are presented with a similar agenda: to extract his philosophy of mathematics directly through his explicit remarks. Since these words on mathematics (which, we now know, constitute over half of the oeuvre) are, when taken literally and at face value, difficult to understand as a consistent whole, Wittgenstein’s seeming wavering on certain questions leaves Fogelin wavering too. Contrary to other interpreters holding dissimilar interpretative ideologies, however, there is no embarrassment here.

The three chapters of Part II address the known staples of “Wittgenstein on mathematics,” i.e., the status of mathematical expressions, the mysteries of mathematics, and logical inconsistency. Familiar Wittgensteinian statements and positions - antiplatonism (but also anti-conventionalism and anti-formalism), a mockery of the bombastic “mysteries” of mathematics, and a tolerance of inconsistencies even in mathematics — are rolled out, now under the enlightening umbrella of defactoism. Doing mathematics de facto means putting applied mathematics before pure mathematics. It is when we go up the path of pure mathematics and the philosophy of mathematics that we forget the basic adjectival use of numerals and, tempted by the superficial similarity of the syntax (not grammar!) of mathematical propositions and empirical propositions, we dither between “mysterious” platonism and “ridiculous” formalism (p. 94). (Platonism usually wins the day since our ordinary context is, mistakenly perhaps, platonistic.) In fact, it is not what mathematicians do, but what we say that they do that merits Wittgenstein’s derision. Or sometimes, in very poignant cases such as Cantor’s transfinite numbers, even mathematicians “rise up” to the call of the philosophy of mathematics and are enticed by the same giddiness that lets us posit arenas of mathematics far removed from practical, de facto mathematics. That is when we leave the rough ground, i.e., the contexts of straightforwardly practiced — finite — mathematics, and assume that we can play the same game in the unconnected milieu of infinite sets. But viewing mathematical propositions as rules (subject to the same paradox of interpretation that haunts all rules) and placing these rules in a defactoist context shows that the Cantorian “paradise” is no paradise at all. Mathematics, in fact, according to Wittgenstein, can weather inconsistencies and defactoism is harnessed, yet again, to describe both ordinary and bizarre situations in which we live with inconsistencies while the practical application of mathematical and logical language is called upon to make short shrift of venerable paradoxes. (Grelling’s paradox merely shows that certain adjectives cannot be used to refer to themselves, while the Liar paradox is not pernicious but merely useless.)

As before, in the rule-following/private language chapters, Wittgenstein’s words are taken seriously and paraded before us as reminders of his strange (because so unconventional) stance on mathematics. “A child has got to the bottom of arithmetic in knowing how to apply numbers, and that’s all there is to it” (Lectures on the Foundations of Mathematics, p. 271). Should we need elaboration on what he is aiming at, Wittgenstein supplies it explicitly, and Fogelin uses it literally: “One would like to say [that Cantor] introduces us to the mysteries of the mathematical world. This is the aspect against which I want to give a warning” (RFM II 40). And as before, where Wittgenstein does not tout an unequivocal single-minded position because such a position would be under the purview of thesis-minded philosophers, Fogelin adopts a similar non-committal posture. So although we reject platonism when asking about mathematical objects, “This doesn’t at all destroy ”SpellE">Frege’s argument; it merely shows there is something fishy" (LFM, p. 145). Wittgenstein will not demolish Frege’s platonism by simply denying it, for as we have seen, denying a thesis means accepting the grammar of its assertion and negation. He makes do with “fishy” while Fogelin, to be consistent with his own reading, ascribes an additional twist of “irony” to Wittgenstein’s evasiveness. Continuing faithfully to follow this Wittgensteinian attitude, Fogelin seems to be just as blasé about leaving or staying in our Cantorian paradise:

Disrupting our complacency about applying the procedure of one-to-one correspondence to infinite sets … would interrupt the smooth flow of the story that seemed to take us almost effortlessly from dancing couples to a hierarchy of ever-increasing infinities. Isn’t that too bad? Well, yes, for people fond of exotic places (p. 135).

Finally, most impressive because so under-stated, is Wittgenstein’s refusal, and Fogelin’s acceptance of Wittgenstein’s refusal, to condemn Frege’s madman (a being whose laws of thought are contradictory to ours) — again a refusal to take a clear stand. This is consistent with what Fogelin has done, with Wittgenstein, by taking Wittgenstein at his word: a revolutionary dismantlement of our basic concepts that does not take a stand on that which cannot be taken a stand on.

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I use the word “revolutionary” with hesitation. Can one be a modest revolutionary? By taking Wittgenstein at his word Fogelin answers in the positive. Adhering to a revolutionary methodology — and there is nothing more revolutionary in philosophy than not advancing theses — this book speaks Wittgensteinian. (I am put in mind here of Clifford Geertz’s comment that some anthropologists “have, wonder of wonders, been speaking Wittgenstein all along” [Local Knowledge, Basic Books, 1983], p. 24.) Doing so runs the risk of exposing one to ridicule. Indeed, as Fogelin recounts and as I can attest, there is nothing more frustrating than presenting Wittgenstein’s philosophy of mathematics to professional mathematicians. But although that may be the price of such unusual work, it holds the added value of supplying a new, insightful reading of Wittgenstein even while it is based on and reminiscent of what we already knew. The constant duality of movement between step-by-step textual detail and deep, contextual holism throughout this book serves to shed light on the exemplary Wittgensteinian themes of private language and mathematics, beyond merely interpreting them (since, as we’ve seen with Fogelin, the paradox of interpretation is at the root of all our misunderstandings). Methodology and content, then, are not divorced; instead, Wittgenstein’s methodology becomes both the means and the end of Wittgensteinian interpretation. Doing this, however, does not mean, as Fogelin thinks, “taking his methodological statements at face value.” These mixed metaphors should be pried apart. Taking Wittgenstein at his word, as Fogelin has done, is a far, far deeper thing than taking him at face value.