According to Christine Swanton, neo-Aristotelian approaches to virtue ethics are committed to two main theses:
- Eudaimonism: it is a necessary condition of a trait being a virtue that it characteristically benefits its possessor.
- A criterion of right action according to which “an action is right iff it is what a virtuous agent would characteristically do in the circumstances” (2, quoting Rosalind Hursthouse 2001, 28).
I have worked on virtue and character for several decades, and yet have never been tempted by neo-Aristotelianism. For both of these claims strike me as clearly false.
In her latest book, Swanton agrees. Her main goal is to motivate, develop, and defend an alternative form of virtue ethics according to which, “What makes actions right, feelings appropriate, and traits of character virtues is understood through the notion of the targets of the virtues” (6). Her book makes very impressive progress towards achieving this goal. In fact, Swanton’s book provides one of the most sophisticated, thoroughly developed, and compelling versions of virtue ethics in the past fifty years. It is clearly required reading for anyone working in this area.
It is also extremely ambitious. The book is divided into three parts, with the first concerned with developing a new objective account in meta-ethics, the second devoted to Swanton’s target centred approach in normative theory, and the third focused on applications. In this review, I will sadly have to leave out most of the details of Swanton’s discussion. My goal is just to briefly summarize the three parts of the book, followed by an examination of one topic to which I wish Swanton had devoted more attention.
Part One is devoted to meta-ethics. There, Swanton outlines a view with the following parameters (9):
Factualism: There are ethical facts; they are part of the fabric of the world.
Objectivism: The facts which make ethical claims true are objective in the sense that they are facts about the world and not the beliefs, preferences, desires, sentiments of the subject.
She also formulates and defends versions of cognitivism, descriptivism, and reasons/fittingness fundamentalism.
How does Swanton spell out her objectivist account? She begins with a broadly Heideggerian approach to ontology, which is outlined in 7 theses, four of which I highlight here (19–20, emphasis hers):
Thesis 1: For an entity to exist as something we can talk about it must have a certain mode of existence; it must have ‘being.’ For example, it exists as a piece of equipment, or as an artwork, or as an object of scientific observation.
Thesis 2: For an entity to have being, one must be able to intend it: we must have intentional access to that entity. To intend an entity is for some intentional state to be about or directed at something, and thereby we make sense of them. Hence there is two-way ontological dependence.
Thesis 3: Intentional access to entities (intending entities) is gained through frameworks of significance. Such frameworks of significance are constituted by what Heidegger calls logos; logoi such as the natural sciences and social sciences, biology, theology, carpentry, art, ethics.
Thesis 6: There are several frameworks (logoi) disclosing entities that are not reducible to the scientific or to any other privileged framework.
When applied to ethics, it follows on this approach that the existence of ethical properties is dependent on our framework for engaging with them (a logos). This is one of many frameworks we have for relating with the world, and the ethical framework in particular is not reducible to a scientific one. As Swanton writes, “The different logoi deal with different kinds of fact: facts such as biological facts, social facts, economic facts, and ethical facts” (34, emphasis hers).
One upshot of this approach, for Swanton, is a response dependent approach to ethical properties, which she formulates as follows:
An ethical property is response dependent if and only if the property is open to certain responses or construals in responders having appropriate sensibilities, and these responses or construals are what make the property intelligible as an ethical property. Without that mode of intelligibility, the property (such as being courageous, being generous, or being patient) could not exist as an ethical property (namely a virtuous trait). (38, emphasis hers)
In the rest of Part One, we find extensive discussion of scientific realism, the nature of ethical facts, the domain of the ethical, the concealment of ethics, and ethical objectivity.
Swanton begins Part Two by pressing her case against eudaimonistic virtue ethics, as understood in (1) above. Here we get rich discussions of flourishing, indirection, and the egoism objection. The upshot is that we need to look for another approach besides the neo-Aristotelian one, and Swanton outlines her preferred account as follows (133–134, emphasis hers):
- The features which make traits of character virtues are determined by their targets, aims, or point, as opposed to the flourishing of the possessor of the virtues.
- Acts are directly evaluated (as right) in terms of their hitting the targets of virtues in action. Hitting the targets of (relevant) virtues in action is what makes actions right.
- What fundamentally motivates an agent aspiring to virtue is attaining the targets of the virtues: the cultivation of virtue is secondary to this aim.
- The field of virtue is directly evaluated as being the proper field of a virtue of character by reference to the point or function of that virtue in the life of a good (virtuous) human being.
What is it to hit the target of a virtue? For Swanton, and in good Aristotelian fashion at this stage, it is a matter of hitting the mean with respect to the “right circumstance, in the right manner, at the right time, to the right extent, for the right reasons, with respect to the right people or objects, deploying the right instruments” (137). On a very demanding version of this view, the right action is the action that hits the mean perfectly, with respect to all of these dimensions. In a change of view from her earlier book, Virtue Ethics: A Pluralistic View (2003), Swanton instead goes with a less demanding alternative, according to which being within an acceptable range is enough to hit the mean and hence be right. Hitting the bullseye dead center, in other words, is not required.
To expand on Swanton’s approach a bit more, the targets of virtues are to be understood in terms of normatively significant features. What features? On a monistic view, there would be only one type of feature, such as hedonistic features. But building on her 2003 book, Swanton instead adopts a pluralistic approach, with four distinct kinds of normatively significant features: value, status, bonds, and the good for an individual (144). Her view is also pluralistic in how it understands what good responsiveness of a virtue to these normatively significant features amounts to; it can include love, respect, creativity, expression, promotion, and appreciation (145).
With these building blocks in place, we get Swanton’s schema for thinking about the rightness of an action (152):
An action is right if and only if it is overall virtuous, and an act is overall virtuous if and only if it hits the targets of relevant virtues to a sufficient extent.
This schema doesn’t entail that the act has to hit the targets of all the relevant virtues. In the Nazi-at-the-door case, for instance, lying to the Nazi can be right on Swanton’s view, while failing to count as honest.
In the remainder of Part Two, we find extensive discussion of topics such as basic versus differentiated virtues, role ethics, virtue development over time, the four kinds of normatively significant features, and the unity of the virtues thesis.
Part Three of Swanton’s book consists of four chapters on the theme of ‘application.’ In the first chapter, Swanton addresses the objection that by providing an account of right action, she is selling out on the project that Elizabeth Anscombe called ethicists to undertake in her famous paper “Modern Moral Philosophy.” The second chapter turns to outlining a particularist virtue ethics which is still codifiable using what Hursthouse called the ‘v-rules.’ Notably, “the reasons codified by v-rules are default reasons which, though not having invariant positive valence, nonetheless apply ‘for the most part’” (266). The next chapter discusses what Swanton describes as paradoxes of practical reason, including supererogation, underdetermination, and ‘it makes no difference.’ Finally, the book ends with a chapter on the epistemological framework that should accompany the target centred approach.
It is common in book reviews to shift at this point to raising one or more objections to the author’s project. But instead, I want to note a topic that Swanton says very little about, and explore it briefly. While Swanton devotes almost the entirety of her book to virtues and right action, it is surprising to find almost nothing about the vices and wrong action. In fact, pretty much all of her discussion of wrongness happens in three paragraphs (150).
Following earlier work by Rebecca Stangl (2020), Swanton ties wrongness to overall viciousness. One might then expect an account that parallels rightness, as follows:
An action is wrong if and only if it is overall vicious, and an act is overall vicious if and only if it hits the targets of relevant vices to a sufficient extent.
But Swanton rejects this parallel because she denies that vices have targets; rather “what counts as vicious is serious failure to hit the target of a relevant virtue” (150). In the next paragraph she adds to this that for the action to be wrong, failure to hit the target has to be ‘sufficiently’ serious.
One question to ask here is why vices do not have targets. After all, it seems like we can tell the same story that Swanton told about virtue in a straightforwardly parallel manner about vice. Each vice could have normatively significant features to which it responds. We could be pluralists about those features. We can also be pluralists about what good responsiveness to those features would look like: appreciation, love, and promotion, for instance, seem like they would apply in the case of vice as well.
Similarly, hitting the target of a vice could be a matter of hitting the mean. For recall that this involved acting in “the right circumstance, in the right manner, at the right time, to the right extent, for the right reasons, with respect to the right people or objects, deploying the right instruments” (137). But the vicious person could do a better or worse job of hitting the mean in these ways. The dishonest person, for instance, could cheat on tests in ways that are subtle or blatant, at the right or wrong time, using the right or wrong instruments, and so forth.
Swanton also offers the following ‘minimalist definition’ of virtue:
A virtue is a good quality of character, more specifically a disposition to respond to, or acknowledge, items within its field or fields in an excellent or good enough way. (206, emphasis hers)
But why can’t a vice be a disposition to respond to items within its field in an excellent or good enough way, qua vice? Stinginess could respond to the needs of others by leading to motivation to keep as much as possible for oneself. Dishonesty could respond to, among other things, someone’s unattended property by leading to motivation to steal it rather than return it. And so forth.
Such a target centred account of vice would also have the advantage of helping to map out the conceptual landscape for categorizing actions stemming from character traits besides the virtues and the vices. After all, continence and incontinence also involve failures to fit the target of a relevant virtue, and in the later case, can sometimes be sufficiently serious failures indeed. The same is true for actions arising from what I have called ‘mixed traits,’ which are intermediate between virtue and vice (see Miller, 2014). But in none of these cases would these actions count as vicious.
Here is one additional point about vicious actions and the ‘sufficiently serious’ requirement of failing to hit the target of the relevant virtue. Some supererogatory actions are quite serious, but by definition are not wrong. Julia Driver’s example is a case in point (1992): Suppose Bob is dying from kidney disease, and the only hope for an organ transplant is his brother Roger, for whom such a donation would not detract from his quality of life at all. Intuitively it seems that if Roger decides against donating his kidney, he is doing something bad but not wrong. It is morally permissible, but not commendable. Yet such a failure to donate surely counts as a ‘sufficiently serious’ failure to hit the target of generosity, on any ordinary understanding of that expression (for related discussion, see Stangl 2016).
So, in future work I hope Swanton will extend her discussion to the vices and wrong action. But this is hardly a criticism of what she has accomplished in this book. It is one of the most comprehensive and groundbreaking books in ethics that has appeared in many years.
Julia Driver, “The Suberogatory,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 70, 1992: 286–295.
Rosalind Hursthouse, On Virtue Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2001.
Christian B. Miller, Character and Moral Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2014.
Rebecca Stangl, Neither Heroes nor Saints, Oxford University Press, 2020.
Rebecca Stangl, “Neo-Aristotelian Supererogation,” Ethics 126, 2016: 339–365.
Christine Swanton, Virtue Ethics: A Pluralistic View, Oxford University Press, 2003.