Taxation: Philosophical Perspectives

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Martin O'Neill and Shepley Orr (eds.), Taxation: Philosophical Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2018, 264pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199609222.

Reviewed by Matthew Braham, Universität Hamburg


Taxation is central to the existence of states. It is its income and expenditure. Taxation finances the production of goods and services that the market undersupplies, is the source of income for those in need, and is used to incentivize behaviour -- to encourage people to reduce the consumption of personally or socially or environmentally unhealthy things and practices. Tax policy is therefore a key element of the wherewithal of our personal lives. Yet, a quick search on work by moral and political philosophers on taxation will reveal an interesting fact: it is a subject that has not received much detailed attention. And, the work that has been produced is somewhat fragmented.

This collection aims at correcting this state of affairs by bringing together philosophers who work mostly at the intersection of philosophy and economics. We are offered 12 new essays that highlight taxation as a key issue for moral and political philosophers. As the editors, Martin O'Neill and Shepley Orr, point out in their introduction, taxation is an "irreducibly normative matter, and one which implicates a number of our concerns of social justice. When we think about issues of social justice in practice, we cannot avoid thinking at the same time about tax" (p. 2). Taxation is foundational to our thinking about property rights, democracy, and the nature and role of the state.

The volume is divided into two parts. Part I (seven essays) focusses on normative and conceptual questions. Part II (five essays) delves into a variety of policy issues. O'Neill and Orr's comprehensive introduction lays out the philosophical context for both parts. They begin with the stark and contrasting positions of Robert Nozick and John Rawls. In a memorable passage in Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974), Nozick claimed that "Taxation of earnings from labour is on par with forced labor" (p. 169). In Nozick's libertarian world view, mandatory taxation is limited to providing for a minimal state that protects and enforces property rights only. Redistributive transfers for those in need are not morally permissible. Such transfers would be injustices, violations of just pre-tax entitlements. Providing for those in need is, rather, a task for charity. In contrast, Rawls believed that there are no pre-political constraints on property rights, which are themselves part of the "basic structure" of society. In the Rawlsian world, a tax system is just insofar as it is part of the overall system of rules and institutions that satisfy his two principles of justice. Hence, given that redistribution is required by Rawlsian justice, it follows that redistributive taxation is morally permissible.

Having staked out the Nozickean-Rawlsian divide, O'Neill and Orr situate the essays within the Rawlsian universe that had its fullest development in the now seminal treatment by Liam Murphy and Thomas Nagel in The Myth of Ownership (2002). Murphy and Nagel's standpoint is that "pre-tax income" has no special normative status; there are no primitive entitlements to property. Many of the essays engage directly with this thought and attempt to find a middle ground between the Rawlsian and Nozickean positions.

An illuminating feature of the collection is that it opens up what Alan Hamlin, in "What Political Philosophy Should Learn from Economics about Taxation", denotes as the "black box" technology of taxation. Political philosophers, he notes, are especially prone to call upon this technology to "put into effect whatever distribution of economic benefits and burdens that is required by the normative theory under discussion" (p. 20). Hamlin unpacks the black box with an elegant review and understanding of different economic theories of taxation: Optimal Taxation, the Political Economy of Taxation, and the Tax Constitution Approach. This is very refreshing and stands out from the stock "economics bashing" that many political philosophers -- even those who claim an economics background -- presumptively engage in without a whimper of thought and respect for the discipline. Hamlin notes that political philosophers with a non-ideal theory bent are well advised to study carefully and with an open mind what economists have to offer. It is fair to say that the collection provides the reader and the disciplines an intellectual programme that goes far beyond taxation.

Marc Fleurbaey's "Welfarism, Libertarianism, and Fairness in the Economic Approach to Taxation" immediately takes up the baton of optimal taxation discussed by Hamlin and defends it against the criticism set out in Murphy and Nagel's Myth of Ownership. Fleurbaey shows us that it is possible to enrich the orthodox optimal taxation theory of welfare economics with elements of libertarianism and fairness. Here, I believe we are observing progress in both philosophy and economics through careful modelling of normative principles bounded by weak descriptive conditions of rational choice. Again, critics of economics take note: Fleurbaey achieves his goal without a formula in sight; however, his formal work on taxation underlies the essay.

Geoffrey Brennan's "Striving for the Middle Ground: Taxation, Justice, and the Status of Private Rights" begins by directly engaging Murphy and Nagel and also by expanding on the Tax Constitution approach outlined by Hamlin. Brennan himself pioneered this approach together with James M. Buchannan in their influential The Power to Tax (1980). Brennan denotes his analysis as "quasi-Rawlsian". There is a methodological reason for this, because he asks what the "constitutional architecture" of society would deliver in terms of a tax system. But this is not about Rawls' Two Principles. Rather, it is an investigation into basic democratic procedures and the structure of private rights (that include property rights) and how these determine a just tax system. That is, the principles of taxation emerge from the interplay of constitutional elements. In an interesting twist to Nozick's "minimal state", Brennan discusses the "maximal state", which is the largest possible state subject to constitutional constraints, one of which is the system of private property rights. One of Brennan's thought provoking conclusions is that Rawlsian principles of justice in a capitalist society will not fully realize Rawls's own principles.

"Taxing or Taking? Property Rhetoric and the Justice of Taxation" by Laura Biron, is more traditionally philosophical. She, too, takes her cue from Murphy and Nagel, but her angle of analysis is that the starting point of thinking about the tax system is philosophical and jurisprudential thinking about property. In a sense, this is Nozick's line (although she comes to different conclusions) and Biron is engaging in a conversation with economists and asking them to go back to conceptual basics. And along with Brennan, she is skeptical about Murphy and Nagel's "myth of ownership".

Peter Vallentyne's "Libertarianism and Taxation" makes clear what a rich subject taxation is for moral and political philosophers. He argues that the moral doctrine that "individuals initially fully own themselves, that natural resources are initially unowned, and that individuals initially have certain unilateral moral powers (requiring no consent from others) to use and appropriate unowned natural resources" (p. 99) supports a variety of views on just taxation. Nozick's right-libertarian view that taxation beyond a charge for the protection of property rights is "on par with forced labor" is just one view. There are also sufficientarian (centrist) and left-libertarian views, with the latter breaking down into two sub-forms of equal-share and equal-opportunity libertarianism. Each of these views permit taxation over and above the Nozickean minimum.

Alexander W. Cappelen and Bertil Tungodden's "Tax Policy and Fair Inequality" is another prime example of an economic analysis that builds in substantive normative reflection. It also picks up where Fleurbaey left off. Cappelen and Tungodden aim to explore the shape of a liberal-egalitarian system (Rawlsian) and in particular to try and get around the well-known problems of responsibility-insensitivity that besets Rawlsian justice (avoiding exploitation of the hardworking and talented). One fascinating result is that they show precisely why political philosophers need to peer inside the "black box" of taxation. In their framework,

a progressive income tax system may have two opposing effects on fairness. It may increase the level of unfairness in society by eliminating fair inequalities reflecting differences in responsibility factors, but it may also reduce the level of unfairness in society by eliminating unfair inequalities reflecting differences in non-responsibility factors. (p. 121)

In other words, we are reminded of the falsity of what John Harsanyi once called the "all good things come together assumption". Desirable values are not always positively correlated. Another very appealing feature of this essay is that the authors cap their analysis with an empirical case study of their fair tax system using Norwegian data. The essay is a "must read" for the modern political philosopher eager to engage with policy-making.

The final essay in Part I is another piece of traditional normative analysis. "Beggar Your Neighbour (Or Why You Do Want to Pay Your Taxes)" by Véronique Munoz-Dardé and M. G. F. Martin takes issue with libertarian views on taxation, in particular that the needy are to be provided for by charity rather than via state redistribution. They argue that there are reasons why redistributive taxation instead of charitable giving would be favoured by the taxpayers themselves. The argument can be summed up as follows: mandatory taxation is simply a more efficient way of collecting and distributing resources for the needy. They write:

Even if you, as a well-meaning individual who keeps their life in good order, manage to provide a large amount in donations to various charities, still it is likely that you will be bothered in some way or another by further charitable organizations looking to raise their income to meet the demands on them. In such a world, the irritations of the double-glazing salesman, or the mortgage salesman, or the new phone deal, would pale in comparison with the campaigns run by the major charities seeking to meet the needs of the poor. (p. 138)

Munoz-Dardé and Martin argue that it is reasonable to reject such a system. This idea is crying out for a carefully constructed economic model that actually delivers a formal proof of the proposition. Until then, the jury is still out.

Part II begins with "The Case for a Progressive Benefits Tax" by Barbara H. Fried. Fried opens Hamlin's "black box" of taxation and investigates it from a "Tax Constitutional Approach". That is, we are presented with the question of whether we "should take the preferences of taxpayers into account in deciding how tax revenues are raised and spent", and are provided with the trite answer: "Of course we should". And it is observed that in a democracy we "automatically will", as these decisions are delegated to elected representatives. But as Fried points out, there is a lot more here than meets the eye. We are asked a difficult further question: is a majoritarian or a supermajoritarian decision rule the appropriate one for determining fiscal policy? Starting from a broadly libertarian premise that taxation is just if it is limited to provision of public goods that the market undersupplies, Fried argues that this implies an individual's tax burden should be limited to cover the price of these goods. This is commonly referred to as "benefits taxation". She then makes an intriguing case for a strongly progressive tax rate for benefits taxation and one that will even permit redistribution for the purposes of social welfare. She ends with a more fundamental issue: "What counts as a public good (benefit) for which the state can rightly charge?" She believes it includes much of our built and social and physical environment: from norms of civility to architecture, good teachers, and well-functioning hospitals. Her version of libertarianism seems to have the capacity to accommodate this position.

Stuart White's "Moral Objections to Inheritance Tax" returns us to a more standard way that philosophers use to look at the world. His task is to carefully dismantle four major moral arguments against inheritance tax: the double tax objection, the equity objection, the virtue objection, and the wrong problem objection. The first says that inheritance tax is unfair because tax has already been paid on the assets; the second says that inheritance tax is unfair because it leads to unequal tax burdens on people who have equal wealth but choose to use that wealth differently; the third says that inheritance tax penalizes virtuous behavior; and the forth says that inheritance tax does not solve the problem it sets out to address (inequality), because it is fixed on inequality of possessions whereas the real issue is inequality of consumption. Depending on your moral priorities, you will or will not agree that White achieves his objectives. It really depends on whether you gauge these objections to be the "strongest possible". Also, defeating four objections does not imply that that the path is clear to impose an inheritance tax. The jury is out on this one, too.

"The Politics of Land Value Taxation", by Iain McLean, ends with a very abrupt paragraph: "Property is not theft. But it could be taxed in a more rational way than at present. In the long run, everybody would gain" (p. 201). This says it all. McLean argues that a land value tax "has both theoretical and practical merit". He examines both the intellectual and political history of land tax drawing mostly on examples from the United Kingdom. A key part of the essay is the section on the practical politics of a land tax. Having discussed the merits of a Land Value Tax, McLean is aware that it is also unpalatable for many, so he asks "How then could a brave government make Land Value Tax for housing acceptable to the median voter?" Here, McLean engages in a form of political engineering with the aid of Public Choice Theory. There isn't space here to set out his four suggestions, but they are eye-opening -- particularly his case of the "Devon widow", which is the situation of an asset rich/cash poor household. His solution is to defer the tax liability until after death or at the time the property is sold.

In "The State and Tax Competition: A Normative Perspective", Peter Dietsch moves the discussion to an area of tax justice that has been largely overlooked by political philosophers: the strategic interaction effects of tax regimes in a global economy. He targets the effect on social justice when states compete with each other for mobile capital through low tax rates and favorable regulation. Although this competition is clearly a way for governments to stimulate economic growth and create jobs, it simultaneously interferes with, and even undermines, the fiscal independence of states and hence their ability to fund public services and meet local demands of social justice. That is, there are spill-over effects of fiscal policy. The underlying question is whether there are any moral limits to the migration of the tax base between countries. "The crucial question", asks Dietsch, "becomes which portion of fiscal interdependence should be considered benign from a normative viewpoint, and which portion should be condemned as problematic" (p. 214). He answers this by introducing two normative principles: the autonomy prerogative and the global justice constraint. That is, for fiscal policy to be just, it must be able to implement autonomous political choices and promote distributive justice globally. Thus, jurisdictional rules on tax competition must be designed so as to respect these twin principles.

In the final essay, "Global Taxation and Accounting Arrangements: Some Normatively Desirable and Feasible Policy Recommendations", Gillian Brock and Rachel McMaster delve into the nitty gritty of accounting practices and how they contribute to what is cogently termed as tax escape -- tax avoidance and evasion. In particular, they examine the practice of "transfer pricing" used for sales and purchases within a company or group of companies. The practice permits profits to be disguised and taxes avoided. Brock and McMaster also provide a review of the characteristics, scope, and effects of tax havens. They offer insight into means for regulating tax escape, including such global taxes as air ticket taxes and currency transaction taxes. At a very practical level they set out four normative and four feasibility criteria for collecting global taxes. They show that air ticket and currency transactions taxes meet these criteria and to their mind serve as an example of how to implement Thomas Pogge's Global Resource Dividend. The book thus ends exactly with the point made at the outset by Hamlin: we need to open up the black box of taxation.

This is a friendly review from someone who works at the interface of philosophy and economics. Does the collection come up short in any way? That would require dissecting each essay –which I haven't taken to be my remit. My remit is the collection as a whole, which I find to be an excellent entry into the world of taxation and an exercise in that growing research area we call PPE. One of my own tests for how good a book is, is whether I would include it as essential reading for an undergraduate course. Yes, I certainly would.

The book's overall message is that the Libertarian, Rawlsian and standard welfare economics views of taxation are much richer, complex, and flexible than generally thought. Regardless of the rhetorical appeal, it really would be best were we to refrain from using the Nozickean forced labour argument, to refrain from simply stating that a tax system is just if it is part of the "basic structure", and to refrain from setting optimal tax theory against fairness. And even if we agree that a tax is justifiable for whatever purpose, it requires careful and detailed elaboration of the tax system itself.