Technē in Aristotle's Ethics: Crafting the Moral Life

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Tom Angier, Technē in Aristotle's Ethics: Crafting the Moral Life, Continuum, 2010, 176pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826462718.

Reviewed by Ron Polansky, Duquesne University


Tom Angier contends that Aristotle's ethical writings base more of their argumentation upon what goes on in the productive arts than has been recognized by commentators, which contributes to the strength of Aristotle's analyses but also leads to some weaknesses. He aims to show that the position in the Nicomachean Ethics in particular depends upon the arts. And this dependence is not merely for illustrative purposes:

Aristotle's ethics is more indebted to those models than is subject-matter dealt with elsewhere in his writings. For whereas his non-ethical writings rarely make use of craft-models in more than a merely illustrative or analogizing fashion, it is precisely in his ethics that Aristotle oversteps the limits of this approach, allowing those models to do more of the argumentative work than he acknowledges (or, for that matter, others acknowledge). (viii)

As background, the book's introduction examines the understanding of techne prior to Aristotle, especially in several Hippocratic treatises that defend medicine's status as an art. The tradition supposes an art should have a clear aim or telos enabling control over its field, provide accurate knowledge so that it can be teachable, reliable, and certifiable, and have ends that are beneficial. Medicine has a clear, beneficial end, bodily health, but how exact is its knowledge, how much control it provides over its field, how certifiable its practitioners are, and how teachable it is are vexed matters in the fifth and fourth centuries BCE and in later times. Chapter 1 continues to provide background by exploring Plato's employment of the arts in the dialogues. Angier looks at references to the arts throughout the dialogues to confirm that Plato adheres to the traditional view of the arts. Plato also importantly links the arts with virtue. He even seems, in the argument about measuring pleasure in the Protagoras and his way of having knowledge of justice in the Republic as a second order art directing the subordinate arts, to entertain the possibility of virtue as a techne or craft. Yet Angier determines that Plato does not finally hold this position. Surely there can be aspiration for expertise in virtue like that in the arts and mathematics, but humans for Plato inevitably lack such expertise in virtue. Glancing at passages referring to arts throughout the dialogues, as Angier does, risks ignoring conversational contexts, but he moves skillfully and gives fuller accounts of pertinent sections of Protagoras and Republic.

Chapter 2 illustrates, by examination of many passages, that Aristotle generally has the same view of the arts as Plato; in contrast with Plato, Aristotle in NE vi 5 openly presents four arguments that phronesis and virtue are not any sort of art. Angier examines these arguments closely. He finds that three of them -- that art has a narrow subject matter whereas phronesis considers the human good generally, that there can be excellence at art but not at phronesis or virtue, and that arts make one capable of contraries but phronesis and virtue do not -- may merely beg the question. One of the four arguments, however, that poiesis (production) differs from praxis (action), is shown to be compelling. How Angier thinks that this works is that production and praxis are evaluated differently. What derives from production, whether an internal or external end, is evaluated without reference to the motivation or intention of the producer, whereas praxis cannot be evaluated apart from the aim and motivation of the person engaged in the action.

This seems correct, but in developing his argument, Angier rejects reducing the poiesis-praxis distinction to the kinesis-energeia (motion-activity) distinction (see 147n23). What he suggests interferes is the possibility of internal ends for such arts as dancing or gymnastics, where the product is not external to the motion of production. But if production is always a type of motion, then the kinesis-energeia distinction already eliminates arts even with internal ends since they are motions, though it does not eliminate them simply based on whether the end is external or internal. Hence Angier is basically correct that production and praxis differ in manner of evaluation, but he could also have fit this with the kinesis-energeia distinction. In this chapter as well Angier impressively explains how the comparison with art allows Aristotle to urge sensibly that deliberation and choice are of means rather than ends. Angier says that any deliberation has to be in relation to some end, even if the end is the ultimate good itself, happiness. And the choice of "means" can be of means that are quite constitutive of happiness itself, rather than merely instrumentally related to happiness. Illustrations from arts foster this understanding of Aristotle's view.

The next three chapters claim that in several crucial areas Aristotle leans heavily on the arts to make his case and that this leaves him with difficulties. Chapter 3 considers the function argument in NE i 7 and how it relates to the controversy whether Aristotle's ethics should be given an inclusivist or dominantist reading: the inclusivist holding that happiness must include activity according to both moral and theoretical virtue, whereas the dominantist insists theoria is the most complete happiness. Angier initially argues convincingly that the human function, activity in accord with reason, is general to include many particular properties of humans, e.g., praying or telling jokes. Despite this generality of function, Angier argues that the dominant end reading fits with the function argument and its context. So far so good, but this requires limited attention to arts. He further attempts, less successfully, to account for Aristotle's supposing a single specialized human activity, i.e., theoria, is complete happiness by viewing this as indebted to the way arts have a definite end (76-77). He admits that "a single, specific function for man is by all accounts an odd notion", but supposes that his looking to the craft-model helps explain it.

My alternative explanation is that a human function is an "odd notion" because outside the context of practical philosophy Aristotle does not refer to functions of complete living organisms but only the functions of their parts, artifacts, crafts, or craftspersons. Humans have a function in practical philosophy because such science has its own sorts of principles. It is more likely that Aristotle elevates theoria as he does because activity in accordance with moral virtue, end in itself though it is, needs to contribute to some higher end to keep well in line. Here Aristotle joins Plato in some doubt about the reliability of human virtue and action. This is why Aristotle, surprisingly, in NE x 7 (esp. 1177b1-26) brings up conquest and tyranny. Political life without an end beyond itself in philosophizing can tend to lose its way. If I am right about this, Angier's contention that "the very notion of ergon has been unduly neglected in the discussion of Aristotle's function argument, and that a specifically technē-shaped conception of function is of explanatory relevance when considering Aristotle's dominantist conclusion" (78) is not especially persuasive. It is instead Aristotle's awareness that practical life directed toward the human good generally differs from the arts with their definitely demarcated end that makes it vital to have practical life further serve the theoretical life. Also, theoria most possesses the essential features of the happy life.

Chapter 4 explores the background in Plato for Aristotle's notion of virtue as a mean. Angier has Aristotle embracing the view from the Philebus of the desirability of a determinate limit of the unlimited, with support from medicine's seeking the intermediate between excess and defect. But Angier thinks, as do many commentators, that overextension of the mean as seeking intermediate quantity between excess and defect runs Aristotle into trouble. (The discussion would be improved if he translated mesotes and meson differently rather than usually both as "mean". Actions and passions should be intermediate or appropriate rather than in a mean.) Angier questions the claim in EE 1222b9-11 that "all the moral virtues and vices have to do with excesses and defects of pleasures and pains" (90-91). But if all voluntary action derives from desire, and desire has to do with the pleasant and painful, then good or faulty action will have to do with appropriate or inappropriate pleasure and pain (NE 1104b30-1105a1). Moreover, since desire pertains to pleasure and pain or the pleasant and painful, desires are passions (pathe), so contrary to what Angier says, unjust behavior will involve pathe.

Besides criticizing Aristotle regarding the intermediacy of passions, Angier attacks talk of the intermediate in action for many of the virtues. But like many commentators he takes too limited a view, so that regarding acting "at the right times, with reference to the right objects, towards the right people, with the right aim, and in the right way" (1106b21-22) only at the right times seems capable of scalar expression (92, esp. n37, and 94-95). Yet we may be too eager or too little eager for some object or to act in reference to some persons or too careless about our approach, and so on. Hence there are clearly numerous ways in which excess and deficiency pertain to every action and passion such that they apply to all the moral virtues and vices. The objection that Angier presents to this interpretation (97), borrowed from Sarah Broadie, that treacherous selling of secrets to the enemy cannot be described in terms of excess and defect, is no objection at all since Aristotle himself insists that acts warranting such labels as adultery, murder, and treachery are always wrong and allow for no intermediate (see NE 1107a8-27).

Chapter 5 investigates moral habituation and development of phronesis. The key question is how the person gets from repeated action to enjoyment of the action for its own sake and recognition of why the action is good. The child being rewarded and punished grasps that (hoti) certain sorts of actions are approved or disapproved, but how does this become genuine appreciation of the good actions and understanding of the on account of what (dioti) they are good? To Angier it seems that Plato and Aristotle are too reliant upon the way the arts allow for this transition. In the arts, through the perhaps grueling effort of learning the art by practice the person comes eventually to enjoy the mastery of the art and understanding of its principles. Here experience (empeiria) turns into genuine art, and the worker who went through the motions with little understanding becomes a master-worker.

But Angier protests, "there is no clear moral equivalent to the craftsman's transition from painful to pleasurable activity, founded on having finally (and arduously) achieved mastery of a particular practice" (122). He thinks it much clearer why the person mastering a techne and its principles derives pleasure from it than in the case of moral learning: "For the practice of virtuous-type acts does not obviously yield satisfaction, certainly not in any comparably clear or intelligible way" (123). He supposes it easier to allow a gap between practice and understanding in the arts than in the development of virtue and phronesis. Yet, is not virtue as a "mean relative to us" in fact relative to human nature rather than the individual? So attainment of virtue as our natural state is difficult but appropriate for humans, and activity in accord with our natural state should be pleasant. And if Michael Frede is correct (in his introduction to Michael Frede and Gisela Striker, eds., 1996, Rationality in Greek Thought, Oxford: Clarendon Press) that for some ancient philosophers such as Plato, Aristotle, and Stoics, reason "has its own needs and desires" (5), development of phronesis will be natural for humans, even if the full development is hardly widespread. Angier rightly points to the gap, but his expectation that it can be eliminated or needs filling in is to be questioned. Learning cannot be simply a linear process, and perhaps reason does have, as Frede suggests, rather fixed aims.

Angier's book is quite sharp in its argumentation and impressively conversant with secondary literature. It is well written and clear. Even where the reader does not agree with the conclusions defended, he or she should still profit from the challenge of the book's reasoning and its conversance with Aristotle's difficult text. That Aristotle's reflection upon the arts shapes his ethical thought quite as much as Angier proposes is unlikely, but nonetheless the case is energetically and skillfully made. The book is finely produced with one great exception, endnotes rather than footnotes. No press should burden readers with having to flip back and forth from text to notes.