Techne Theory: A New Language for Art

Placeholder book cover

Henry Staten, Techne Theory: A New Language for Art, Bloomsbury, 2019, 199pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781472592903.

Reviewed by Alan H. Goldman, College of William & Mary


This is a book about creativity in the arts. Its thesis is opposed to the Romantic view of the artist as a lone genius who creates completely original works in flashes of inspired insight from the depths of his soul or deeply personal emotion. For the Romantic, the true genius's work will violate all past conventions and practices in embodying a radically new concept. She creates this work in a moment of divine-like inspiration ex nihilo.

For Henry Staten, by contrast, there is no sharp line to be drawn between art and craft, as the artist, like the highly skilled craftsman, draws on a tradition of practical know-how built over long periods in domains within a culture. Implied in this tradition are possibilities for its extension discovered by the artist, who must then elaborate on and embody them in her material through her highly skilled practice. Staten notes that this view of the artist as skilled craftsman predates the Romantic elevation of the artist to mystical creative genius. Traditionally sponsors told artists what to paint, and the artists then drew on their extensive practical knowledge and skill in painstakingly executing the work in the available materials.

In fact, both of these sharply opposed models of artistic creation can be traced back to Plato, who viewed the poet as possessed, in a state of quasi-madness, and the painter as a highly skilled craftsman who could fool viewers of their works into thinking them real. Each model has dominated in different historical contexts, and Staten is one representative of the swing of the pendulum back in the direction of the more mundane and claimed to be less mysterious theory of creativity. He notes that the Romantic model persists among audiences for art but not among modernist and post-modernist artists themselves reacting against Romanticism more broadly. Along with current psychologists who write on creativity, Staten claims to demystify creative activity.

Staten is well versed in both ancient and continental philosophical traditions, and so his sources are not what an analytic philosopher like myself would expect -- philosophers such as Arthur Danto or Noël Carroll who emphasize the importance of the art-historical tradition for making and understanding art at any given time, or the above-mentioned cognitive psychologists who have developed a rich literature on the nature of creativity. Instead, Staten cites Plato and Aristotle, about whom he demonstrates considerable expertise, 20th century French and Irish poets writing autobiographically, and a British art historian writing on Picasso. His thesis echoes also Roland Barthes' 'death of the author,' although, while Barthes substitutes the reader's interpretation for the author's creative genius, Staten appeals to the tradition of skilled practice. The structure of the book is not the linear development of an extended argument, but variations on a theme. Each of the diverse chapters makes for highly interesting (and for an analytic philosopher refreshingly different) reading, including a chapter on Kafka's Metamorphosis, whose fit is mysterious to me, except for its once more very interesting interpretation.

To illustrate the nature of techne according to Staten, I can best begin with some quotations. In briefest terms: "Techne is just practical know-how." (4) More elaborately and speaking of the evolution of the artistic tradition in new works:

The algorithms of evolution carry on a mechanical search of this logical space, actualizing forms that were merely potential in it, pruning out forms that are not viable, preserving and repeating those that are, accumulating design. In biological evolution, there's no actual selection, only pruning, while in technosocial design there is selection also. (184)

In this mostly mechanical description, the role of the artist is fourfold: he sees gaps in the conceptual space of prior practice, sees possible new combinations of elements implicit in that tradition, chooses among them, and skillfully executes his choices in the materials. It is the tradition of practice that suggests to the perceptive artist new combinations of elements for its extension. The artist must only materialize them. Genius is simply a combination of perception based on prior knowledge, and skill acquired through practice. As to the artwork: "Form is a product of the combinatorial properties of the well-designed organa of a well-designed techne system; and such form is what physiognomic perception of any kind, including aesthetic perception, perceives." (100)

The perceptual model not only reduces genius to perceptiveness and practical or manual skill, it virtually reduces the agency of the artist to a pawn in the ongoing march of art history:

A high modernist painter working his paint is from the techne standpoint, fundamentally and irreducibly nothing more -- or less -- than a highly skilled manual worker . . . (155)

to what degree the thinker is the 'agent' by which the new physiognomy is constructed, and to what degree it comes together out of properties of the combinatorial system itself, is indeterminable and probably not a meaningful distinction . . . (29)

the 'grooves' of the techne can lay down the patterns along which the creative labour can then find its way. (124)

Staten stops short of a strict art-historical determinism, but the influence of Hegel, although not explicitly mentioned, is obvious here.

Evidence for this nevertheless unspiritual theory of creativity includes new breakthroughs or styles initiated by more than one creative icon simultaneously: Newton and Leibniz, Picasso and Braque (both reacting to Cezanne), Bach and Handel, Haydn and Mozart (building on earlier classicists). When two or more artists initiate a new style simultaneously, it appears to be the Zeitgeist that is dictating its movement to them. The example of Picasso is discussed by both Staten and psychologists who refer to the well-documented development of Guernica, both its structure and characters, through many steps harkening back to his earlier works and those of other artists such as Goya. There is certainly no doubt that every creative breakthrough is some kind of reaction to a tradition that first had to be mastered through years of study and practice within a domain (typically, psychologists claim, about ten years).

But that great works typically develop slowly through earlier and sketchier attempts and that they require prior mastery of a domain does not entail Staten's theory of creativity, despite its present hegemony in psychology as well. I see three main lines of criticism. First, as to the originality of Staten's position. Aside from the lack of mention of such philosophers as Danto, Carroll, and Levinson, who also emphasize the crucial role played by the art-historical tradition in the creation of new works that can be recognized as art, such lack of mention being understandable given the philosophical tradition that Staten is coming from, psychologists of creativity, as noted, have been saying very similar things for decades. Here are the absolute briefest of samples from leading texts summarizing the current state in that sub-discipline:

creative thinking is not different from ordinary thinking . . . (Weisberg 2006, 5)

The existing ideas that form the new mental structure aren't new; they're familiar ideas and conventions that are already in the domain and that have been internalized by the creator . . . (Sawyer 2012, 114-115)

novelty is a transformation of cultural practices . . . this approach emphasizes the creation of practices, not the creation of products . . . (Sawyer 2012, 266)

The emphasis on practice and on combining concepts implicit in the tradition in creating new works are common themes. But the psychologists specify various steps in the typical creative process in more detail than does Staten. These might include mastery of a field, finding gaps or problems in the existing practice, generation of novel ideas and combinations, narrowing down the possibilities, experiencing a moment of insight signaling a restructuring or new direction, often after an impasse and period of rest or diversion, working out the solution or new work concretely often with significant elaboration and revision. The penultimate step, the so-called 'Aha moment', is a central bone of contention among theories of creativity.

I am no great creative genius, but my personal writing experience is replete with such instances of flashes of insight when not consciously working on a philosophical problem. It's the norm rather than the exception. Staten and the above cited psychologists play down or completely dismiss such occurrences. Staten writes: "inspired states in general are marginal phenomena, gee-whiz occurrences that tell us nothing significant about art, the reality of which is the teachable and learnable practices of communities of artisans." (120) Psychologists dismiss the relevance of such first person reports despite their being well documented in many autobiographical statements of true creative geniuses. The psychologists bemoan the fact that these experiences are rarely if ever generated in the experimental psychology lab (Weisberg 2006, 445). This strikes me as disciplinary bias. Personal reports are the best evidence we have for the experiences of true creative geniuses, as opposed to undergraduate psychology majors tested in the labs.

So second, to return to Staten, I don't see that he explains (or explains away) moments of true creative inspiration. Undoubtedly unconscious processing takes place in rest periods leading up to such occurrences, but that such processing fits Staten's description of simply drawing out implications of the tradition of practice seems unlikely. Even psychologists' measures of creativity among normal individuals appeal to degrees of divergent thinking -- how far 'outside the box' subjects are able to conceptualize.

Relatedly, Staten fails to distinguish between those working within a style or paradigm and those revolutionaries who initiate new styles or paradigms. Thus, third, while his theory might capture the creative efforts of most artists, it seems less applicable to true geniuses such as Van Gogh or Mahler, to name just two who lived in the same period. While Van Gogh might have been influenced by the impressionists and Gauguin, his art could hardly be seen as implicit in earlier tradition, creating instead a new paradigm of color and expression for the Fauves and German expressionists. And while Mahler might have been influenced by Bruckner and Wagner, one cannot but hear his music as a radical departure. The inspiration that leads to such seemingly miraculous works remains a mystery to me after having read Staten. Given our reaction of awe, aren't some mysteries better unsolved?

Even lesser works might not be fully explained in techne terms. Staten takes a series of monochromatic paintings, 'actualized painting,' to be the best illustration of techne theory: "All art is techne, but what makes actualized painting so strikingly rich for techne theory is that its techne is so immediately bound up with its materials." (154) But even here there is still a question whether this style was implicit in the techne of painting all along, or whether it represents a novel conception only partially prepared for by recent modernist history. However interesting or uninteresting aesthetically, behind the movement may be a creative idea in a richer sense than techne theory allows.

Despite these criticisms, Staten represents well one end of the spectrum of theories of creativity. As noted, his view might well capture the work of most creative individuals. And it fits the Zeitgeist of much modern and post-modern art, the breakdown of any sharp line between fine and popular art, as well as the continental collectivist ethos. Perhaps no one theory will fit all creative or artistic endeavor, even at the present time (his view perhaps not fitting well with conceptual art). Staten's writing, while not analytically transparent, is clearer than most in the continental tradition, and he clearly demonstrates wide knowledge of sources remote to most current aestheticians. To those well versed in the recent psychology of creativity, Staten's thesis will be familiar. But for analytic philosophers of aesthetics, who have for the most part neglected the topic of creativity, this book is interesting and creative in both style and content.


Sawyer, R. Keith. 2012. Explaining Creativity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Weisberg, Robert W. 2006. Creativity, Hoboken. NJ: John Wiley & Sons.