Technology and the Virtues: A Philosophical Guide to a Future Worth Wanting

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Shannon Vallor, Technology and the Virtues: A Philosophical Guide to a Future Worth Wanting, Oxford University Press, 2016, 309pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190498511.

Reviewed by Benjamin I. Huff, Randolph-Macon College


Shannon Vallor makes a compelling argument for renewing the cultivation of the virtues in order to meet the challenges of our technological age. She argues on the one hand that rapid technological change creates a special need for moral virtues to guide us in choosing among our many possible futures, and in managing new and unexpected opportunities and hazards. On the other hand, she argues that changes in technology create new challenges to the cultivation of virtue itself which call for wise and creative responses.

Vallor takes a comprehensive approach, addressing both theory and applications. In Part I, she articulates the need for "a technomoral virtue ethic of global scope" (64) to guide both individual and collective decisions. In Part II, she surveys the resources of three ancient moral traditions: Aristotelian, Confucian, and Buddhist. She then draws on these to formulate the essentials of her own contemporary theory, including an account of moral development or self-cultivation and a list of virtues. In Part III she deploys her theory in the context of four particular areas of emerging technology and "technosocial" practice: social media, surveillance, robotics, and human enhancement. In each case she insightfully examines not only the difficult questions these technologies raise for moral action and choice, but also the challenges they pose to human moral development.

The cumulative case is quite impressive. Vallor ranges over three widely diverse moral traditions from the ancient world, then connects their concerns with the intricacies of urgent contemporary problems. She combines an erudite approach to the exotic with a charming attention to daily experiences like the effort to resist electronic distractions. Surveying the array of challenges that new and emerging technologies pose, one keenly feels the need for greater moral resources to address them, both as individuals and as a global community. Where discussions of the virtues can easily feel stilted and stuffy, especially in the context of ancient traditions, Vallor's readable work shows how the development and exercise of virtue or its opposite is a natural and integral part of contemporary life. At the same time, Vallor perceptively captures the many subtle ways in which character development can be distorted or undermined by new technologies and the new social arrangements they generate.

Students and scholars of both the virtues and technology will find a great deal to interest and stimulate them here. Moreover, Vallor's book captures the special blend of excitement and precariousness that is woven into our lives today by our use and reliance on constantly changing technology. At the same time, the wide-ranging nature of her work leaves a great deal of room for debate, disagreement, and further exploration. Her argument that we urgently need more robust strategies for the cultivation of virtue is difficult to resist. Questions of what form these could or should take, however, and how to establish them, remain wide open.

Part I is in many ways the most visionary portion of the book, and the most risky. Here Vallor describes the need for a virtue ethic that is accessible to people across the globe, transcending particular cultures. Virtue theory is the best place to look for the kind of guidance we need because the virtues are "ideally suited for adaptation to the open-ended and varied encounters with particular technologies that will shape the human condition in this and coming centuries" (33). The effects of any given technology, let alone the possibilities brought by future technologies, are difficult to foresee, especially when technologies are brought together. The resulting "acute technosocial opacity" severely limits the ability of theories that rely on predicting consequences, or formulating moral rules, to guide us (23). Hence there is no substitute for the flexibility, sensitivity, and good judgment of practical wisdom, developed as widely as possible.

At times Vallor's efforts to emphasize what is new can seem excessive. Human activities have always been "technosocial," deeply shaped by the available technologies and methods at hand. Mechanized agribusiness is very different from subsistence farming; navigating a canoe by the stars is very different from flying on a commercial airline; and virtues of industriousness and courage are exercised very differently across these contexts. Similarly, human relationships and character have always been shaped by technology-based activities, as well as by the structure of society and other conditions, so that our virtues have always been "technomoral." Taking a job in a far-away country has very different implications today than in an age of horse and sail. The shift from farms to factories and increasingly specialized and mobile labor has dramatically transformed family, extended family, and community relationships, creating major challenges to the cultivation of virtue long before the information age. Vallor's chosen terms remind us of these changes that technology drives, however, and today the pace of change itself has become a major feature of the moral landscape.

Vallor persuasively argues that a "global technomoral virtue ethic" is highly desirable, if not necessary, as a basis for the "robustly cooperative global deliberations" that we will need to address a range of problems and threats that can only be solved through globally coordinated action (51, 55). These problems include "global climate shifts, the emergence and spread of new pathogens," the effects of dynamic global markets, or simply the demands of peace and security in an interdependent world (48). To establish such a global ethic is an extremely ambitious goal, however, whose feasibility depends on the results of Part II.

To guide us in formulating this new virtue ethic, in Part II Vallor fittingly draws on three ancient traditions, arising in very different cultures. The broad scope of her work requires Vallor to concisely present a particular interpretation of each tradition, relying on the secondary literature she cites to support it and address competing interpretations. The accounts she offers are quite representative, however, and capture remarkably well the distinctive tone, texture, vocabulary, and structure of each account.

Juxtaposing the Aristotelian, Confucian, and Buddhist accounts reveals deep differences among them, including widely diverging visions of the content of the virtues and of the good life for human beings. The moral exemplars held up by these three traditions would find much to criticize in each other. Vallor frankly acknowledges these differences. In seeking commonalities she wisely focuses not on the particular actions or forms of life they recommend, but rather on "shared conceptual resonances" regarding the structure of virtue, and shared dimensions of moral self-cultivation (64).

Vallor identifies seven "core elements" of moral self-cultivation -- activities and traits that are either constitutive of the virtues, or necessary to their development. These are: moral habituation, relational understanding, reflective self-examination, intentional self-direction of moral development, perceptual attention to moral salience, prudential judgment, and appropriate extension of moral concern (64). Vallor's discussion of these elements does much to illuminate what the virtues are and how they operate, in ways that are implied but not always spelled out in ancient accounts. She perceptively assembles and interprets a wide range of evidence to show that these elements are represented in each of the three traditions.

The list of virtues Vallor offers is also promising: honesty, self-control, humility, justice, courage, empathy, care, civility, flexibility, perspective, magnanimity, and technomoral wisdom (120). These virtues correspond in varying degrees to traits identified in the ancient traditions she draws upon, and indeed are valued as moral ideals "in almost all societies" (121). Thus what we need today is not a new set of virtues, but an ongoing maintenance and renewal of the virtues and the wisdom involved in them, to guide us through continually new conditions.

The virtues in Vallor's list are not all parallel in form. Virtues like honesty and courage are defined by proper responsiveness to certain kinds of goods and evils; others are traits of a more general kind. An Aristotelian, for instance, might argue that rather than being virtues in themselves, traits like flexibility and perspective are features of any virtue. This list of virtues is thus theoretically looser than the traditional lists, and does not directly carry any of them forward. Rather than providing conceptual tidiness, Vallor's framework is most successful in deepening our awareness and intuitive grasp of the texture of moral life and judgment. By describing traits that cut across a few categories, she brings out features of virtue that might otherwise remain concealed. A somewhat loose structure may also lend itself better to the open-ended development she envisions (120).

Vallor's list of virtues could of course be extended in many ways. When every mobile phone can upload photos and video to the internet, when hundreds of people one knows from diverse contexts may all browse the same Facebook feed, and vast amounts of information can be transmitted easily around the world, the virtue of discretion acquires a new urgency: the disposition to appropriately share information, thoughts, and feelings, or refrain from sharing them, with sensitivity to the audience and context. Alongside Vallor's virtue of flexibility, our increasing exposure to people with widely disparate moral perspectives also calls for a virtue of resolve: the disposition to retain one's moral perspective while navigating very different, potentially disorienting social and cultural contexts. Vallor's examples establish a strong pattern, however, to guide further efforts in this vein.

As rich as they are, this framework for moral self-cultivation and taxonomy of technomoral virtues remain highly abstract. Vallor provides the outlines of a technomoral virtue ethic, but leaves most of its content very much to be determined. Further, amid technological change, as she admits, "human beings around the globe have never been less certain what honesty as a virtue looks like," (121) and the same is surely true for many if not all of her virtues. What then are the prospects for a truly "global technomoral virtue ethic"?

I suggest that the aspirations Vallor expresses in Part I are even more ambitious and fraught than she acknowledges, and should be tempered for several reasons. Global agreement on the content of the virtues, sufficient to constitute a single, concrete virtue ethic, is too remote a goal to focus on for the foreseeable future. Indeed, various competing efforts to form a global community united by shared moral principles have already been playing out on the world stage for centuries without resolution, such as the Augustinian City of God, the Muslim Ummah, the liberal-democratic "free world," or the Marxist international workers' movement.

The challenges are particularly sharp for a virtue ethic today, despite virtue's many advantages. To sustain a standard of virtue requires a shared recognition of moral exemplars, within a moral community united by a measure of trust. Yet families and local communities that might otherwise be prone to such a shared recognition have been increasingly fragmented over the past century through social changes driven by industrialization and new transportation and communication technologies. Thus our ability to cultivate the virtues has already been weakening for generations, even without the newer challenges that Vallor perceptively describes. Exemplars deserving our trust become harder to identify with confidence, even as we feel the need for them more keenly.

Despite these headwinds, establishing a shared virtue ethic within a global subculture, at least, may be achievable and desirable. At the same time, where a global ethic comes into tension with distinct, local cultures, it has the potential to become a source of discord itself. This fact has come into sharp focus in the few months since this book's publication, as major elections and referenda across the north Atlantic region have been dominated by tensions between advocates of nationalism and advocates of globalism, with globalists often on the losing side. Constructive moral progress at a global level will have to embrace deep moral pluralism for the foreseeable future.

At the same time, Vallor's call for a global effort to wisely meet our challenges together remains urgent and appropriate. While a globally shared virtue ethic as such may be out of reach, a shared vocabulary for discussing virtue can be of great value even within a rather loose "pros hen pluralism," united merely by a pragmatic goal of working out "some way to live well with one another" (54-5). A shared moral vocabulary can contribute to mutual understanding and support an ongoing tradition of moral engagement among cultures. It can also help a variety of cultures and communities to update and enrich their own practices of moral cultivation in culturally situated ways. Here, a highly general framework and taxonomy such as Vallor's is just what is needed, arising from reflection on three highly diverse moral traditions, without committing to any of them in particular. At the same time, for those who as a result of rapid technological and social change feel increasingly removed from historic conceptions of virtue, this structure offers a flexible model for reconstituting a living tradition.

Each chapter in Part III offers a helpful overview of a particular sector of emerging technology and technosocial practice, with the challenges it raises, and original analysis by Vallor. Chapter 7 explores how social media have reshaped our relationships and emotional life in ways both subtle and radical. Vallor encourages us to examine more closely those who have successfully incorporated social media into a healthy lifestyle, learning from their virtues and redesigning our habits and platforms to support our flourishing rather than undermining it. Chapter 8 compares new "panoptic" surveillance techniques and the Quantified Self movement with the classical ideal of an examined life, and calls us to guide the former by the latter.

Chapter 9 considers the costs to our character of handing over morally significant tasks to robots, from combat to caregiving, and argues, with the Confucian Mengzi, that there are troubles that "a good human being will not avoid" (215). Chapter 10 considers the prospect of radical human enhancements such as brain-computer interfaces or genome editing. Vallor highlights the widespread tendency to consider these choices through a lens of radical freedom, but invites us to ask, with Nietzsche, what we wish to be free for. Before we can make wise decisions about technological means for human enhancement, Vallor suggests, we will need to invest much more wisdom in identifying our goals for a positive human future.

This book skillfully deploys a classical Confucian model for sustaining a moral tradition: "She who by revising the old knows the new, is fit to be a teacher" (Analects 2:11, Leys trans., modified). It formulates a framework for virtue theory on the basis of ancient models, and then displays the power of that framework to chart a wiser path among transformative technologies. It thus presents a forceful case for the contemporary importance of the virtues, with timely guidance on how to sustain them. I hope that others working on contemporary theories of virtue will build on Vallor's momentum.