Teleological Realism: Mind, Agency, and Explanation

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Scott Sehon, Teleological Realism: Mind, Agency, and Explanation, MIT Press, 2005, 264pp, $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262195356.

Reviewed by Sara Worley, Bowling Green State University


In this lucid and well-written work, Scott Sehon addresses the longstanding issue of how to reconcile our common-sense conception of ourselves as agents with the scientific picture of the world. Sehon argues that common-sense psychology is neither reducible to physical science nor is it in competition with physical science. Rather, it provides an independent, but equally legitimate mode of understanding and explanation. Common-sense psychology is distinctive in that it provides teleological, rather than causal, explanations of behavior.

The book is divided into three parts. In the first, Sehon argues that the question of how to reconcile our common-sense and scientific pictures of the world can be sharpened by formulating it as a question about the relationship between the claims of physical science and those of common-sense psychology (hereafter abbreviated as 'csp'.) He argues that there are three options: (1) csp conflicts with or contradicts the claims of physical science, (2) csp can be reduced to physical science, or (3) the two sets of claims are logically independent of one another. In this section of the book, Sehon also provides a defense of a modified Nagelian conception of reduction against the Churchland-Hooker model, and a nice discussion of whether functionalism is a form of reductionism.

In the second part of the book, Sehon argues that neither option 1 nor option 2 is correct. He argues that both options 1 and 2 rest on the false presupposition that csp is a 'proto-science.' Unfortunately, his discussion of what's involved in being a 'proto-science' is rather vague. He resorts to using phrases such as 'being in the same conceptual space' and 'playing the same game'. However, one can infer from his discussion what he thinks is involved. He argues that csp is not proto-science for three reasons: it is essentially normative; mental state attributions are context dependent in a way which is not consistent with scientific practice; and the states posited by csp are not natural kinds.

There is also a second component to Sehon's argument against options (1) and (2). On his broadly Nagelian account, reduction requires that the reduced theory be derivable from the reducing theory with the aid of bridge laws, which relate the predicates of the two theories. But there must also be appropriate bridge laws if one theory is to contradict another, since one theory cannot contradict another if they have no predicates in common. So if physical science is to either entail or contradict csp, there must be bridge laws connecting the predicates of csp to those of physical science. But csp is essentially teleological. It explains behavior by specifying the goal or end at which the behavior was directed. Physical science, in contrast, deals only with causation.

Thus, if physical science is to either entail or contradict csp, it must be possible to provide a reductive analysis of teleological notions in causal terms. Sehon argues that we have reason to be skeptical about the possibility of such a reductive analysis. He analyzes two attempts to find such an analysis, those of Mele and Peacocke/Bishop, and finds each wanting.

Accordingly, then, option (3) must be correct, and csp must be logically independent of physical science. But of course this leaves open the question of what our attitude should be towards csp. Perhaps we should reject it, or hold it only instrumentally.

In the third part of the book, Sehon argues that we should adopt a basically realist attitude towards the claims of csp. He argues that to reject it on the grounds that it is not part of science would be to accept, in effect, the claim that the only truths are those of science. The claims of csp are, however, better entrenched and more central to our conceptual scheme than is the claim that the only truths are those of science. Similarly, he rejects instrumentalism. He grants that we sometimes do use, for the purposes of explanation and prediction, theories which we don't believe, e.g., Newtonian mechanics. However, in these cases we have some sort of explanation available for why the false theory can nonetheless be used successfully. In the case of csp, however, we have no way of explaining away the apparent success of the theory. To use this robustly successful theory, without having any other explanation of its success, while claiming that we are not really committed to its truth would be, he says, "philosophical pretense." (p. 213). There would be no content to the claim that we are using the theory only instrumentally.

Although much of the argument in the book is of high quality, a couple of the arguments miss their mark. For instance, Sehon argues against the claim that intentional states can be causes of behavior. He first argues that if intentional states are causes of behavior, they must be brain states. He then asks us to consider the following triad of claims:

(x) reification fails, i.e., science fails in identifying brain states plausibly identifiable with mental states

(y) there are mental states

(z) mental states are identical with brain states (the "Standard View")

These three claims are inconsistent with each other. On the assumption that (x) is true, which should we reject, (y) or (z)? Plausibly enough, we should reject (z), the Standard View. As Sehon argues, the idea that there are mental states is well entrenched in our conceptual scheme -- certainly better entrenched than the idea that mental states are identical with brain states. So on the assumption that reification fails, we should reject the standard view. So far so good. But the next step in his argument is a good deal less plausible. The standard view, on his reading, is a philosophical view. The truth or falsity of philosophical views does not, he argues, depend on empirical facts. So the truth or falsity of the standard view does not depend on the empirical question of whether reification fails. So since the standard view would be false should reification fail, but its truth or falsity doesn't depend on whether or not reification fails, it must be false whether or not reification fails. But surely there's a more modest way of interpreting the standard view than as an a priori philosophical claim, independent of the empirical facts. One might regard it as part of an explanatory hypothesis, intended as part of an explanation of why, for instance, people's behavior accords so well with their intentional states. The hypothesis might well turn out to be false, in which case we would need a different account of the relationship between mental states and brain states, and a different explanation for the success of intentional ascription. But the fact that the hypothesis might be false, for all we know, is hardly grounds for saying that it is false.

His discussion of supervenience is also a bit odd. He appeals to supervenience to show how a non-reductionist theory can still be naturalistically acceptable. Accordingly, he responds to the objection raised by Horgan, Kim, and others that supervenience is by itself not a satisfactory solution to the mind-body problem. The objection, as I take it, that the mere fact that one set of properties supervenes on a different, naturalistically acceptable, set of properties does not show that the first set of properties is also naturalistically acceptable, since supervenience is mere property covariance. The objection is made vivid by noting that even dualism is compatible with supervenience. What's needed, therefore, is an explanation for why supervenience holds, which explanation can show that the supervening set of properties is appropriately metaphysically dependent on the subvenient properties. Sehon's response to this seems to miss the point. He grants that dualism is technically compatible with supervenience, but suggests that this shouldn't be worrisome, because the sort of dualism that tempts most dualists isn't in fact consistent with supervenience (since most dualists want to accept the possibility of minds without matter). But whether or not most dualists would accept that mental properties supervene on physical properties is not the point: the point is that insofar as supervenience is compatible with dualism, supervenience does not do the necessary metaphysical work.

I also have worries about some of his conclusions, which seem to go well beyond the evidence that he provides. It's one thing to argue that csp is not a scientific or proto-scientific theory but that it is nonetheless a legitimate mode of explanation and understanding. But it is quite another to conclude, as he does, that because csp is neither science nor reducible to science that therefore the success and applicability of csp is a brute, irreducible fact, subject to no explanation. He suggests that the claims that human beings have goals appropriate to their values, epistemic states, and intentional states, and that they act in ways appropriate to achieving these goals, again subject to their epistemic and intentional situations, are claims which the teleological realist must regard as brute, irreducible facts (p. 219). We can explain why intentional ascription and prediction work for chess-playing computers (because they were appropriately programmed (p. 211)), but we can't, apparently, arrive at an analogous explanation for the fact that intentional ascription and prediction works for human beings. But it's a far cry, it seems to me, from saying that csp is not a science or proto-science to saying that therefore its success in explaining and predicting behavior has to be left as a mystery.

To see that the issues are different, consider again a chess-playing computer. Insofar as computers can be treated as agents, even instrumentally, the same normative and teleological elements will be present. We will be able to attribute goals to the computer, based on some of the same considerations that we use to attribute goals to human beings. (We can assume, of course, that each such program will have the overarching goal of winning each of its matches. But subsidiary goals, such as dominating the center of the board early, may be attributable to particular programs, depending on their 'behavior.' The methods we use to attribute such subsidiary goals are presumably analogous to the methods we use to attribute such goals to human beings -- what makes best sense of behavior, given the circumstances and context, etc.). We will be able to normatively evaluate the appropriateness of the subsidiary goals, and the means that the program chooses to achieve them. If Sehon is right, these intentional-stance ascriptions will be neither science themselves nor reducible to a science. But that doesn't mean that we can't give any explanation for why such ascription works for the computer program. The simplest explanation, of course, will be that the program was designed so that intentional ascription would work for it, but presumably a more complex explanation is available in terms of the actual structure and workings of the program. That intentional ascription works for chess playing computers is not a mystery, and is not a mere brute fact, even if csp is not itself a science.

Analogously, then, why not think that there is some explanation of why intentional-stance ascription works for human beings? Surely there is some cognitive story to be told about how it is that people formulate the goals that they do, and a further story about how people manage to behave in ways appropriate to their goals. It's not just a big cosmic coincidence that people's brains, complicated physical structures that they are, manage to be organized in such a way that they reliably produce intentionally interpretable behavior. And we don't have to suppose that it's just coincidence, or a brute inexplicable fact, even if we do suppose that the normative and teleological elements that play a role in csp make it neither a science nor reducible to a science.

Despite these shortcomings, there is much that is worthwhile about this book. Sehon provides penetrating criticisms of the views of a number of authors, including Baker, Mele, Bishop, Peacocke, Bickle, and Antony and Levine, and extended discussions of the views of Dancy and Schueler. The book contains very nice discussions of a number of issues, notably the questions of whether functionalism is a reductionist theory, whether mental-state terms pick out natural kinds, and whether supervenience is compatible with non-reductionism (to be distinguished from the question of whether supervenience is sufficient for naturalism, which question I discussed above). The text is also quite well written, and generally is admirably clear. It seems usable as a text for upper-division undergraduate or graduate courses. Indeed, some of the discussion, including Sehon's discussions of dualism and functionalism, seem pitched in such a way as to make them accessible to someone not in the field. Nonetheless, the book can also be profitably read by people working in philosophy of mind or action, or who are otherwise concerned with questions of reduction.