Teleology in the Ancient World: Philosophical and Medical Approaches

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Julius Rocca (ed.), Teleology in the Ancient World: Philosophical and Medical Approaches, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 331pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107036635.

Reviewed by Jacob Rosen, Harvard University


This is a good collection of articles on teleology in ancient Greek philosophy and medical writing, derived from a conference held at the University of Exeter in 2009. It should be consulted by specialists doing research in those fields. It will not be especially accessible to the wider philosophical community, but it does raise some interesting philosophical issues, and I will discuss some of those here.

An overall philosophical mission for the book is suggested on the dust jacket: 'The ancient origins of teleological concepts are sometimes either conveniently forgotten or given a distorted appearance. . . The purpose of this book is to restore the balance.' This seems to promise a somewhat systematic, historical and philosophical investigation of teleological concepts. How did ancient Greek philosophers and scientists understand concepts such as 'end', 'function', and 'for the sake of'? What roles did these concepts play in ancient Greek medicine and philosophy, and how did they come to play these roles? What exactly is being forgotten or distorted today?

Few of the articles try to tackle such foundational or conceptual questions head on. Most could be regarded rather as case studies, examining what various ancient thinkers thought to be the ends, if any, of a range of things including names, numbers, cities, diseases, the moon, and the world as a whole.

It would be unfair to demand of twelve papers by twelve authors that they cohere into a single systematic account of anything. Still, if I had a wish for the volume, it would have been for more explicit dialogue and comparison among the contributions. Different contributors seem to have quite different background views about teleology, and the differences largely go undiscussed. This made it hard to tell, when comparing different articles, whether I was encountering disagreements among ancient thinkers, or just disagreements among the articles' authors.

For example, consider a statement by John Dillon near the beginning of his article on Plotinus and Iamblichus: 'Teleology, it seems to me, implies above all purpose, on the part of someone or something' (p. 92). Many Aristotle scholars of the past half century have avoided the word 'purpose' when discussing natural teleology. Perhaps they have agreed with J. H. Randall (Aristotle, 1960), who writes that the word in English 'means "foresight" and "intention,"' and that 'final causes, telê, are for [Aristotle] a much broader class than the subclass of "purposes"' (Randall 1960, p. 125). What exactly is Dillon's position on this? Does he disagree with Randall about the meaning of the word 'purpose'? Or does he think that teleology implies foresight and intention? If the latter, does he think that Aristotle would agree with him, or is he only speaking for Plotinus and Iamblichus? I wish that the Aristotelians at the conference had pressed him on these questions, and that he had said more in his article.

The articles in the first two parts of the book -- 'The Socratic Foundations of Teleology' and 'Plato and the Platonic Tradition' -- seem, with one exception, to align with Dillon's point of view. These articles treat questions about teleology closely together with questions about the intentions of human or divine agents. David Sedley (ch. 1) argues for a view of Socrates as originator of the Intelligent Design argument; Harold Tarrant (ch. 3) discusses theories of names as products of an Anaxagorean divine intellect or of a Platonic divine name-giver; Jan Opsomer (ch. 4) reviews Plutarch's presentation of competing Platonic and Stoic accounts of the divine and providential causes of the moon. Dillon himself (ch. 5) wonders how Plotinus' natural teleology coheres with the view that the highest divinities (the One and Intellect) are completely disinterested in the natural world; Dillon's solution seems to lie in the fact that lower divinities, such as the World Soul, take a providential interest in things down here.

All this fits perfectly well with standard accounts of Platonic teleology, as against Aristotelian teleology. I have no objection, but I note that the dust jacket suggests there is something deeply wrong with standard accounts ('ancient teleology has been obscured by the theological cloak of creationism', it says).

The exception among the Plato articles is by Samuel Scolnicov (ch. 2). Scolnicov claims that there is teleological structure both in numbers and in Ideas for Plato; he does not suggest that there is any intention or foresight involved. However, Scolnicov's conception of teleology seems to be much broader than anyone else's in the book. He identifies teleology with 'unidirectional organization' (pp. 51-3), apparently with no requirement that there be truths involving 'for the sake of' or 'end' or 'function'. At least, he does not say that any numbers or Ideas exist for the sake of anything, or have an end or function, even as he claims that they exhibit teleology. Personally, this strikes me as an implausible use of the term 'teleology'. (I would deny both that organization implies teleology, and also that teleology implies organization: I can kick over a coffee pot for the sake of making a mess.) This would have been an opportunity for the contributors to hash out an important conceptual issue.

The remaining parts of the volume are titled 'Aristotle and the Aristotelian Tradition' and 'Teleology in Medicine'. There is overlap of topic, since the physician William Harvey is treated in the Aristotle section, and Aristotle is treated in the Medicine section.

One philosophical theme in these parts concerns the compatibility or incompatibility of teleological and mechanistic explanations. Monte Ransome Johnson (ch. 7) aims to show that Aristotle thought of teleology and mechanism as compatible, and even that Aristotle was 'the original and classical mechanistic philosopher' (p. 150). Johnson has worthwhile things to say about Mechanical Problems and its relation to texts such as On the Movement of Animals. However, I think the argument for his main thesis misses the mark. What Johnson shows is that there are goal-directed processes in Aristotle which, after being initiated by non-mechanistic causes (e.g., by intentions and pleasures), then continue through a mechanistic sequence of causes and motions. This, I think, is uncontroversial. (For modern examples, think of winding the clock or putting a quarter in the Wurlitzer). Johnson presents himself as disagreeing with figures like R. J. Hankinson and E. J. Dijksterhuis, and those authors (as I read them) suggest only that teleology is incompatible with wholly mechanistic explanation. The enemy of teleology, in the words that Johnson quotes from Hankinson, is the view that 'nature is such as to be completely describable without remainder in terms of purely mechanical laws of working' (p. 125, n. 1, quoting Hankinson 1998; emphasis added).

Hankinson discusses related themes in his article on embryology (ch. 12), which traces changing attitudes to mechanistic explanation from the Hippocratics through Aristotle to Galen. (Here, again, I wished for explicit dialogue between Hankinson and Johnson.) The Hippocratic theory of embryology in Semen and Nature of the Child is non-teleological and wholly mechanistic; Aristotle's account is teleological and partly mechanistic; Galen's is teleological and non-mechanistic. Hankinson explores the reasons for Galen's dissatisfaction with Aristotle's appeal to an automaton-like intermediary in his theory of reproduction, and for Galen's attraction to the view that a sort of intelligent craftsmanship must be at work throughout the process of generation.

Hankinson seems to doubt whether Aristotle's account is genuinely teleological, to wonder if his appeals to ends could be reduced or analyzed away. There seems to be more than one puzzle worrying Hankinson, and I found it hard to pick them apart, but I will try to present one line of argument. The argument begins from the thought that processes of generation arise from antecedent conditions that necessitate them. (We need not suppose that the antecedent conditions are purely materialist or mechanistic, they can be 'as rich as you like' (p. 268).) This leads to the thought that, given the presence of necessitating conditions, 'things would occur even if their final causes were absent' (p. 269). This requires parsing. On one reading it is trivial, since final causes are typically absent: for example, it is when houses are absent that builders build for the sake of houses. A better interpretation of Hankinson's meaning, I think, is: things would occur even if they did not occur for the sake of their (actual) final causes. (Example: I walk down the street to buy cookies. The question 'would I have walked if the final cause were absent?' means: would I have walked if I hadn't walked for the sake of cookies?)

So then, suppose that antecedent conditions C obtain, and are sufficient for the emergence of a completed form E. Suppose that a process then occurs for the sake of E, and successfully results in E. If C had obtained but nothing had occurred for the sake of E, a process resulting in E would still have occurred (because C is sufficient for the emergence of E). So if we are asked to explain why the process occurred, is there reason to say 'for the sake of realizing E', in addition to saying 'because C obtained'? Hankinson, if I understand him, is worried that the additional claim makes no genuine contribution to our explanation, even if it is true.

This is an interesting worry, with many possible lines of response. I will mention one, because I thought I saw a hint of it in Mariska Leunissen's article (ch. 6). This response would involve explaining that an (actually) end-directed process's occurrence does depend counterfactually on its occurring for the sake of its end. The explanation would be that the way in which the antecedent conditions bring about the process is precisely by setting up this end. This is suggested by Leunissen's claim that many animal parts are generated 'through conditional necessity: if there is to be an animal of that form, it must have these very parts' (p. 117). This means, if I understand correctly, that when an efficient cause of animal generation acts for the sake of realizing a certain form, animal parts will be generated through the very fact that they are necessary for the realization of the form.

On this view, the efficient cause sees to it that things occur for the sake of an end E, and this fact then plays an irreducible role in explaining why a process resulting in E occurs. The view answers Hankinson's puzzle. But it is also mysterious. It is as if, whenever I set out to bake cookies, sugar came to be in my kitchen directly through the fact that it was needed for cookies. (Directly and not mediated, say, by the intelligence of Jeeves). This doesn't happen in the realm of human action, so why, or how, or under what circumstances, does it happen in Aristotle's nature? I wish Leunissen had said more.

This review has focused on places where I saw opportunity for more philosophical dialogue among the contributors. I have not, obviously, described the main results of every article in the book. I now briefly touch on the articles I have not yet mentioned. R. W. Sharples (ch. 8) gives a clear and level-headed discussion of ancient commentators' reception of two well-known passages in Aristotle (the 'Rainfall' passage in Physics 2.8 and the 'General' passage in Metaphysics Λ.10), concerning the question 'whether teleology operates on the level of individual organisms or on that of the world as a whole' (p. 156). James Lennox (ch. 9) describes the depth and variety of ways in which William Harvey was influenced directly by Aristotle. Elizabeth Craik (ch. 10) tracks early signs of teleological thought in Hippocratic writings, suggesting early interaction between medical and philosophical writers. Philip van der Eijk (ch. 11) discusses views of disease in Plato, Aristotle, and Galen. For each of these thinkers, disease is proof that things occasionally, and indeed frequently, fail to serve their functions and achieve their ends; nevertheless, each thinker incorporates disease within an overall optimistic, teleological picture of the natural world.