Teleosemantics: New Philosophical Essays

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Graham Macdonald and David Papineau (eds.), Teleosemantics: New Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2006, 232pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199270279.

Reviewed by Timothy Schroeder, Ohio State University


Teleosemantics emerged in the early 1980s, grew rapidly to prominence in the philosophy of mind, and soon had a flourishing literature. It was set to have truly far-reaching influence, to bear its best fruit, when it was trampled into sociological oblivion by the horde of philosophers rushing to study consciousness. Since about 1995, teleosemantics has received the attention accorded to the merely effable by people rediscovering ineffable mysteries.

Graham Macdonald and David Papineau are undaunted. With a new anthology, they remind us that there is still life in the teleosemantic project, and encourage us to return to investigating it. The project, recall, is that of explaining how mental states get their contents, and of doing so in terms of the functions brain states have. The teleosemanticist holds that, just as the heart has the function of pumping blood, the brain has functions too. Brain states given the function of corresponding to features of the world are thereby made into representations with contents: brain states designed to correspond to movement represent movement, brain states designed to correspond to the presence of conspecifics represent the presence of conspecifics, and brain states designed to correspond to world peace represent world peace. This, at least, is the basic picture.

 Teleosemantics contains ten new essays, plus an introduction from the editors that is as good a guide to teleosemantics as anything in print. The solicited essays are all from well known friends or foes of teleosemantics: Rob Cummins (with co-authors Jim Blackmon, David Byrd, Alexa Lee, and Martin Roth), Fred Dretske, Peter Godfrey-Smith, Frank Jackson, Mohan Matthen, Ruth Millikan, Karen Neander, Carolyn Price, Dan Ryder, and Kim Sterelny.

Kim Sterelny leads off the friends of teleosemantics, arguing that there is good reason to doubt that many of our specifically linguistic capacities have been built into us by natural selection. "Language is not merely evoked by experience" is the way Sterelny puts it (p.38), though this is a rather modest formula relative to the ambitions of the paper. Sterelny suggests that, because language is only useful insofar as it allows communication, it is difficult for natural selection to build ever-increasing linguistic capacities into animals like ourselves. Imagine a group of hominids with some linguistic capacities, and imagine a mutant with more powerful capacities. If the mutant is unique, there is no advantage in having the enhanced capacities, but there is a disadvantage (stemming from likely miscommunication). This paper does not particularly bear on teleosemantics, but it is a good warm-up exercise for the reader: Sterelny's argument involves often controversial claims about which capacities are likely to have been naturally selected and which not, and such claims are essential to teleosemanticists.

Peter Godfrey-Smith leads off the critics. Godfrey-Smith is skeptical that there are mental representations at all, let alone the sort posited by teleosemantics, if 'mental representations' means something like 'mental things that are literally representations'. This thought begins a sketch of a new way of conceptualizing what a theory of mental representations might be doing: "we might see the idea of mental representation as the application of a particular model to mental phenomena" (p.44, italics in original). Just as one can think of molecules on the model of balls attached by springs without thinking that molecules are literally made of tiny balls attached by springs, so too can one think of the mind on the model of representations -- on the model of maps, gauges, and the like -- without thinking that what the mind is made of is literally a system of maps and gauges. And if a scientist is using this sort of model to understand the brain, then certain problems arise, Godfrey-Smith points out: if there is a cortical "map" in the brain, the question what it is a map of becomes pressing. What the cortical "map" was selected for doing can help to answer this question. Hence teleosemantic thinking retains its value even if we give up on the idea that there are literal mental representations.

Fred Dretske and Frank Jackson contribute a complementary pair of papers, Dretske defending teleosemantics and Jackson attacking it. Both philosophers note that teleosemantics raises an obvious problem with regard to knowledge of the mind: if the theory is right, then your having a mind entails your having a long evolutionary history (this being where teleosemantic functions come from). But then, knowledge of your mind, or justified belief, would seem to require knowledge of, or justified belief in, that history, and this is implausible. Dretske's approach is to argue that the conclusion need not be so implausible: one can know what one thinks without recourse to theory, even if one can only know that one thinks with theoretical support. Jackson's approach is to argue that the blow to teleosemantics is fatal. Jackson takes the unusual direction here of arguing that, since one can have justified beliefs about minds without having justified beliefs about histories of natural selection, the two must be different things. Those who think that one can, in some sense, have justified beliefs about Superman without having them about Clark Kent, will be tempted to object to Jackson's direction. And Jackson's response to such objections, though interesting, takes the reader straight into Jackson's philosophy of language, leaving teleosemantics behind.

An obvious objection to teleosemantics has always been that no brain state has natural functions that relate it to televisions, events outside its light cone, or Jasper Johns: to anything that was not part of our collective history of natural selection. Ruth Millikan has addressed this objection at length in other work; in this volume she brings her various remarks together in one unified framework. The beginning of her answer is the point, familiar to her readers, that if the function of a particular neural structure requires correspondences to prominent objects in the environment, and televisions are prominent objects in the environment, then performance of the function requires correspondences to televisions. Millikan adds further layers of subtlety to this basic idea, displaying the full range of resources a teleosemanticist has to address the problem.

Another objection to teleosemantics has long been that it is unable to solve Fodor's infamous "disjunction problem." Suppose that a neural structure produces a state that in fact corresponds to the presence of televisions and certain quickly glimpsed computer monitors (i.e., televisions and things that might be mistaken for them). What justification is there for holding that the neural structure is correctly representing televisions as televisions and misrepresenting the computer monitors as televisions? Why not instead hold that the neural structure is correctly representing televisions-or-quickly-glimpsed-computer-monitors? Dan Ryder takes up this problem. His proposal is much like Millikan's: there are certain robust sources of correlated properties in the environment, and these are what our neural structures have the function of producing correspondences to ("modeling," in Ryder's jargon). What is especially distinctive in Ryder's proposal is a bold hypothesis about the way in which such correspondences get brought about at the neural level. If Ryder is right, then certain neurons ("SINBAD cells") have intrinsic dispositions to change their connections with other neurons such that input from these other neurons tends to come all together or not at all, and this disposition effectively creates a disposition for SINBAD cells to be triggered by robust sources of correlated properties in the environment: by televisions, but not televisions-or-quickly-glimpsed-computer-monitors.

Mohan Matthen's paper is also closely tied to work by Millikan. Although I have so far characterized teleosemantic theories as ones according to which certain brain structures have the function of producing correspondences to the world, this is not the best way to state Millikan's view -- or Matthen's either. Matthen and Millikan embrace a "consumer"-oriented form of teleosemantics, on which content is not determined by the function of the correspondence-producing brain structure, but by the function of the correspondence-using ("consuming") brain structure. According to the consumer-oriented teleosemanticist, the content of a mental representation is that to which the produced brain state must correspond if the consuming brain structure is to perform its function (in the historically normal way). Matthen argues that a consumer-oriented teleosemanticist has various virtues. Perhaps the most interesting claim is that it allows an attractive position on colors and other secondary qualities. It is not plausible, Matthen thinks, to hold that colors are represented by us as surface reflectance properties of objects. But then, this is not the information the consumer of a representation of a colored surface needs to do its job in any case. Rather, Matthen holds, the consumer of a representation of a colored surface needs to know whether that colored surface is the same as, or different from, selected paradigmatic surfaces. Is the surface the same color as the inedible leaves, or a different color, the same as the edible berries? So we should expect colored surfaces to be represented in us as fitting into a space of samenesses and differences -- which, Matthen suggests, is just what we find our naive knowledge of colors to consist in.

While Matthen sees reason to look less to the details of the stimulus and more to the details of the response in order to determine the content of a mental representation, Karen Neander argues the teleosemanticist should do just the opposite. She suggests that, if the mental representations attributed by teleosemanticists are to match those required by cognitive scientists, then these representations must have contents that track "operational explanations of cognitive capacities" (p.168). Neander tells us much about the cognitive capacities of the toad, and of the parts of its brain that receive input from the eyes and produce three sorts of behavior: prey acquisition, no change, or predator avoidance. From a consumer-oriented teleosemantic perspective, this description of things might seem ideally perspicuous: the prey-acquisition system needs to know that there is prey present in order to do its job, and so input to it must represent that there is prey present. But Neander argues that such contents do not line up with those needed to explain the details of toad cognition the way that working scientists would explain them, since the brain states in question do not carry information about prey as such. Better, she holds, to attribute to the brain state the content that certain configurations of visible features (small high-contrast bug-like shapes or longer, horizontally oriented, high-contrast worm-like shapes) are present in the receptive field. Neander's argument combines some fairly standard points for content internalism and against content externalism with some less familiar ones more specific to the case at hand, though she does not fully engage the arguments of arch-externalist (and "consumerist") Millikan at every point she might.

The final foes of teleosemantics are Rob Cummins and his collaborators. They argue that teleosemanticists have made a mistake in thinking that the content of a mental representation is identical to the content that is used or useable by the representing system. As Cummins et al. would have it, most representations have "unexploited" content, content that is available in the representation but not at present useable by the representing system. For instance, to a person who does not understand the representation of topography in a map, a topographical map has both exploitable content (the compass-point relations of the various locations mapped) and unexploited content (the heights of the various locations mapped). This is also the situation within our own brains, claim Cummins et al. And in fact, they hold, this must be so, for there is no way for natural selection to select a brain state for carrying a useful content unless it carries that content before being selected for doing so, something they see as a serious problem for teleosemantics. The likely response of the teleosemanticist, that natural selection can select a brain state for instantiating a useful correspondence before instantiating that correspondence is its function, is treated at the end of the paper. There, the most satisfying answer given is that the thing that Cummins et al. call 'content', and which typical teleosemanticists are more likely to call 'information' or 'correspondence', is the thing that "ultimately does the work in representationalist cognitive science" (pp.205-6). But how does information or correspondence do "the work" in cases of misrepresentation? The putative special virtue of teleosemantics -- its ability to give a theory of error -- is not given full consideration here.

The final friend of teleosemantics is Carolyn Price, who argues for an extension of teleosemantic thinking to a little-considered domain: the emotions. Her paper, "Fearing Fluffy: The Content of an Emotional Appraisal," begins by noting that emotions are generally triggered by states that, although belief-like in certain respects, are not always beliefs. For instance, I need not believe that the hissing cat before me is dangerous to be scared of it, but I need to have some such belief-like attitude toward the cat. Price calls this attitude an "emotional appraisal." It is the emotional appraisal that triggers the physiological and behavioral responses to the cat that are characteristic of fear. But what is the content of this appraisal? Price argues on teleosemantic grounds that the content is something quite complex. In the case of fearing a hissing cat, the content Price defends is that "that cat is very threatening; avoid being injured by it -- by running away from it now or by lashing out at it now or by hiding from it now." This content is indicative in part, and imperative in part, and this is how emotional appraisals can play the roles they do in both informing us how the world is and leading us to respond. At least, this is how Price sees this particular emotional appraisal working. (Why this needs to be the content of just the appraisal, rather than a combination of contents of both an indicative appraisal and of some imperative-forming consumers of the appraisal in specific emotion systems, was never clear to me.) Price's paper acknowledges that other emotional appraisals -- those involved in happiness and sadness, anxiety, and many other emotions -- might differ greatly in their contents, but she hopes to at least capture the content of the particular emotional appraisal she considers.

As a whole, Teleosemantics suggests that not much has changed in the field since 1995. The leading teleosemanticists still believe what they did, and are ready to say again why they have not changed their minds. Prominent critics are still unconvinced, though their arguments rely on so few assumptions shared by the teleosemanticists that the latter are under little epistemic pressure. And internal disputes within teleosemantics have advanced little. There are a few striking developments -- Godfrey-Smith has gone from advocate to critic, for instance -- but by and large Teleosemantics demonstrates that the field has been in something close to stasis while work on consciousness has been so vital. Call it 'overwintering'. Spring will come again -- there is too much good philosophy in the teleosemantic project for it not to -- but it isn't here yet.