Temporality and Trinity

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Peter Manchester, Temporality and Trinity, Fordham University Press, 2015, 156pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823265718.

Reviewed by Scott M. Campbell, Nazareth College of Rochester


In this brief yet insightful book, Peter Manchester looks backwards, using Martin Heidegger to interpret Augustine, as though the thinker who lived later were somehow influencing the earlier one. This approach is refreshing. Instead of tracing the historical development of ideas, Manchester explicates Heidegger's trinitarian understanding of temporality in Being and Time in order to shed light on the human image of God in Augustine's On Trinity. This approach demands that one look deeply into the issues and, instead of treating philosophy as intellectual history, take up the matters themselves and search for insights, which is just what Manchester does. He proceeds by closely reading philosophical and religious texts in order to open up a way of thinking about the temporality of the human being in its truth, disclosed as a trinitarian image of God. "At issue," he writes "is human authenticity as image of God (imago dei), specifically an image of divine trinity -- Father and Son in one Spirit" (59).

In the simplest terms, this book aims to connect the tripartite structure of Dasein's temporality in Being and Time to the trinitarian theology of On Trinity, where Augustine describes the human image of God in terms of memory, understanding, and will.

After introducing the topic, this book consists of three chapters. There is no conclusion, but the third and final chapter attempts to bring things to a close.

The first chapter analyzes, but mainly criticizes, Heidegger's understanding of ecstatic temporality in Being and Time. The chapter opens by differentiating time from temporality, a key distinction that has clearly informed much of Manchester's work. Time, he says, is an ordered succession, what he elsewhere calls a series of transitions; temporality, on the other hand, refers to past, present, and future, which Manchester calls "in no way timelike," saying that they are not "parts of time" (8). Using both Kierkegaard and Heidegger, Manchester thinks of temporality as an event, instead of as a series, and this enables him to apprehend "the synthesis of time and eternity" (14) in a moment of revelation, an idea that returns in the third chapter in a fascinating re-reading of the Gospel of John. Manchester criticizes Heidegger mainly for his reading of Aristotle, but he also finds fault with Heidegger's notion of "clock time." Heidegger claims that the clock measures time, but Manchester suggests that we do not use clocks to measure time so much as we use them simply to tell time. To measure time, one would more readily use a stopwatch (49). Nonetheless, Manchester finds in Heidegger's notion of ecstatic-horizonal temporality a way of thinking about the trinitarian structure of the human being in Augustine's On Trinity, which is the subject of the next chapter.

The second chapter may seem anachronistic to some because it employs phenomenological language to describe key concepts in Augustine, but Manchester has made it clear that this is his method, looking backwards, from Heidegger to Augustine, in order to illuminate the structure of the human being in On Trinity. This chapter constitutes the heart of the book, and it contains numerous insights into Augustine's "phenomenology of revelation" (93) that Manchester opens up using Heidegger's understanding of ecstatic-horizonal temporality. Toward the end of the chapter, in a remarkable feat of hermeneutical synthesis, he makes explicit connections between the existential structure of Dasein in Being and Time and the human being as the imago dei in On Trinity, revealing the following structural symmetry:

             Heidegger                              Augustine

                                 the past                                 mind
                                 having been                           memory (memoria)

                                 the future                               self-knowledge
                                 projection/anticipation           understanding (intelligentia)

                                 the present                             love
                                 being –alongside                     will (voluntas)

In a way, Manchester's use of Heidegger is fairly simplistic, and he says as much throughout the book. The temporal structure of Dasein is trinitarian (past/present/future), and so is the structure of the human being in Augustine (memory/understanding/will), but the simplicity of this relation, the number three, belies a temporal intensity in human experience that Manchester is trying to capture. I should note here that "temporal intensity" is my phrase and not Manchester's, but it is the best way I can succinctly describe his project.

In both Heidegger and Augustine, temporal priority is given to the future, and in the third and final chapter, Manchester exploits this in order to engage in a powerful and innovative interpretation of the Gospels. He focuses on revelation and prayer to show that a temporal interpretation (as opposed to an interpretation based on time) is necessary to apprehend the notion of trinity in the New Testament. In a remarkable section toward the end of the chapter, Manchester looks at the first 23 verses of the Gospel of John. He places those verses relating to eternity on the left-hand side of the page and those relating to time on the right-hand side in order to demonstrate the textual interweaving of time and eternity in Gospel revelation. Earlier in the book, with reference to Heidegger and Kierkegaard, Manchester referred to the notion of a moment that is found in time but which belongs to eternity, and his reading of the Gospel of John here illustrates that sense of moment. The chapter and the book close with a discussion of table fellowship in the Gospel of John.

It is unfortunate that this book does not have a conclusion. I have a sneaking suspicion that the author wanted to keep it to three main chapters in order to reinforce the trinitarian nature of the book's theme. If that is the case, then I appreciate the symbolism, but I would have benefited more from a conclusion that pulled the three chapters together and then pointed toward the future interpretive possibilities that this book opens up, for there are many. Manchester makes the point that he is not doing philosophy of religion because he is trying to confront the historicality of New Testament theology directly, but using Heidegger to understand Augustine and the Bible is not exactly theology. So, if he is not doing philosophy of religion or even, strictly speaking, theology, what is he doing? A conclusion that defined the new approach he is taking, which clearly involves a phenomenological approach to religious life, would benefit his readers.

Scholars of Heidegger will note straight away that Manchester does not take up the early lecture course that Heidegger delivered as Introduction to the Phenomenology of Religion during the winter semester of 1920-21. In that lecture course, Heidegger draws the conclusion that the early Christians lived time because they experienced the temporal intensity of their faith on a daily basis. The decision they made to become Christians activated their faith as they lived in the present and waited for the second coming, which for them could happen at any moment. They lived their faith as an intense, temporal experience, what Heidegger called a context of activity with God. I would think that Manchester might find in these pages a description of the intense, trinitarian religious experience that he is looking for in Augustine.

A conclusion would also help to clarify one of the more interesting problems that emerges in the book, two slightly different senses of temporality and the relationship between them. For Manchester, temporality consists of past, present, and future, conceived not as succession or order but rather as a unified whole. In his discussion of Kierkegaard, however, he says that the synthesis of time and eternity is an event that gives rise to temporality (14). Temporality, he claims, is then the source of the distinction he wants to make between time and temporality and is necessary for understanding ecstatic temporality in Being and Time (14). What is the relationship between thinking of temporality as the unified whole of past, present, and future and thinking of temporality as the synthesis of time and eternity? Does one need to understand temporality as this synthesis in order to apprehend temporality in both Heidegger and Augustine? What are the implications of this for understanding both thinkers? There is an intriguing relationship here that could have been addressed in a concluding chapter.

The first chapter consists mainly of a criticism of Heidegger's reading of Aristotle on time and his analysis of now-time. Manchester's criticism is thoughtful and imaginative. The gist of it is that when Heidegger claims that now-time measures time, he does not take into account the fact that the clock which he says is measuring time has a graduated clock face (52). It is these units that make the movement of the hands on the clock a measurement. Manchester concludes from this that Heidegger's claim that clock time is matter of counting nows is untenable. Manchester also claims, as I mentioned earlier, that we use clocks primarily to tell time, not to measure it. He says that the clock helps us to coordinate with what Heidegger calls the temporality of everydayness, making it not so much a measure of time as a way of telling time in average, everyday life.

Manchester's criticisms of Heidegger here are astute and interesting, but I found it difficult to determine the role of these criticisms in the book as a whole. They do not seem to contribute to our understanding of ecstatic-horizonal temporality in Being and Time, which Manchester uses in subsequent chapters to elucidate the structure of the human being in Augustine. What Manchester does do is make explicit connections between ecstatic temporality and authenticity, which is of great value to the study of Heidegger, especially when Manchester goes on to describe authentic temporality in Augustine in the second chapter. At times, Manchester's reading is both powerful and compelling. Allow me to highlight one instance of this.

Using Heidegger, Manchester develops a way of thinking about the temporal intensity of moments in our lives, when past, present, and future manifest not as a succession but rather as a unified whole. Describing Augustine, Manchester writes,

In recollections of his early life, the distance is large between what he thought he was doing then and what he now sees God was (and is still) doing in him. As he comes toward Monica's death and his ordination, that distance closes, so that finally, in the very writing of Confessions, the ecstatic having been of the exercise of memory gives rise to the ecstatic presence of God in prayer and confession -- these two together in the ecstatic future of love, the donum dei, Holy Spirit as the gift of God. (93)

I quote this long passage in full because it demonstrates the heart of Manchester's book, in his words a "phenomenology of revelation," which "gets worked out explicitly as a temporal problematic in Trinity, as becomes apparent when it is viewed in juxtaposition with the temporal problematic of Being and Time" (93). For Manchester, Heidegger's understanding of ecstatic temporality and authenticity serve as a way of understanding what Augustine means when he speaks of the human being as "the image of God," which is revealed in the temporal intensity of human experience.

At the beginning of the book, referring to the period in which Being and Time was written, Manchester claims "It is no longer out of the question to look for theological implications in the Heidegger of that period." (1). Considering the work of Karl Rahner and others who have found Heidegger's early work theologically fruitful, I think that it was never out of the question to find theological implications in the early Heidegger, but in the end that does not matter. Manchester has given us a novel and interesting way to use Being and Time. His book is highly readable, includes close, detailed scholarship, and is replete with philosophical and theological insight.