Ten Moral Paradoxes

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Saul Smilansky, Ten Moral Paradoxes, Blackwell, 2007, 144pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405160872.

Reviewed by Caspar Hare, Massachusetts Institute of Technology


As it says on the cover, this book introduces and discusses ten problems in normative and applied ethics. Quickly, and in order: When are things that benefit us, on the whole, rightly considered misfortunes? When does the fact that someone else will do my job better oblige me to retire? How do we punish fairly, given that the socially disadvantaged, who are less deserving of punishment, require more extreme deterrents? What's wrong with blackmail? What's wrong with threatening severely unjust punishment, and thereby ensuring compliance with the law? When is it morally okay to be glad that something morally bad happened? How much income should 'non-effectives' (people who, due to circumstances beyond their control, have no ability to generate income in the free market) receive under a choice egalitarian scheme? Is something of value lost when civilization advances to the point where we are no longer routinely subject to powerful moral demands? Do people who wrong others in a certain way have a right to complain about being wronged by others in the very same way? When is it appropriate to wish that you were never born?

The common thread in all these diverse problems, for Smilansky, is that they give rise to 'moral paradoxes'. This looks like a very spare thread. Think of a paradox in the standard way, as a seemingly valid argument with appealing premises and an absurd or contradictory conclusion, and almost any interesting philosophical problem gives rise to a paradox. For almost any interesting philosophical problem there is something at issue, whether p, and appealing things to be said for and against it. Take 'p and not-p' to be your conclusion, the appealing things to be premises, and you have a seemingly valid argument with appealing premises and a contradictory conclusion.

But presenting philosophical problems as paradoxes does have its uses. In particular, it is a way of grabbing the attention of beginning students of philosophy, by showing them that there is an uncomfortable tension between things that they are instinctively inclined to accept. Smilansky's book is excellent in this respect. His writing is clear and lively. He avoids unnecessary technicalities. His ideas are grounded in vivid examples.

Nor is this just a taster-menu of problems in normative ethics. Smilansky draws attention to some problems that have been neglected, and some that are, to my knowledge, original. I think that many professional philosophers will enjoy reading his book, and get something out of it. Let me illustrate by discussing two of the chapters in more detail.

In "Morality and Moral Worth" Smilansky asks whether there is something of value in being moral -- in meeting serious moral obligations. He frames the question by having us consider an ideal scenario, 'the well-arranged minimal-morality world', in which very few people have serious moral obligations. The residents of this world are not routinely confronted with preventable suffering, injustice and need (think of Denmark, but vegetarian, and encompassing the whole world). They find it 'easy to be moral'. They have gained much, but have they also lost something?

On one view, which Smilansky calls the deprecatory view, no. Meeting your moral obligations is like taking out the trash. You have to do it, but if, by some magic, there were no trash to take out then that would be all to the good. This is the implicit view of many moral philosophers. It is better to eradicate evil than to let it thrive, better still that there never be any evil to eradicate.

On another view, which Smilansky calls the laudatory view, yes. Serious moral obligations make moral heroism possible. Moral heroism is a marvelous thing. We would be poorer for the lack of it. A certain sort of value would be missing from the world, a value that Smilansky calls moral worth.

Part of Smilansky's project is to bring out what is attractive about the laudatory view. And there certainly is something attractive about the view. It is something that Nietzsche would recognize: good is the shadow of evil; remove the evil and you remove its shadow. And it is something that anybody who has ever made a movie would recognize: you cannot have a movie without heroism; you cannot have heroism without villainy.

But, as Smilansky points out, moral worth is by nature a fragile, endangered thing:

Moral worth is contingent upon conditions that morality is obliged to try to eliminate. The purpose of true morality is to eliminate certain conditions (suffering and grievous wrongs). Yet, only if those conditions exist can they call forth the moral actions that uniquely confer moral value. Paradoxically, morality is the enemy of moral worth.

You gain moral worth by slaying dragons. But slay enough of them and you will find that there are no more to slay. Nor can you can create them, to slay them. That would be morally unworthy.

This may seem like an academic point. The world is not a vegetarian Denmark. We have plenty of moral obligations to keep us busy. But Smilansky makes a case that, in the West at least, this is the direction in which we are headed. Are we thereby losing something? That is an important question. Furthermore his observation brings out a sort of bad faith that exists in some moral crusaders. Some moral crusaders value the crusade. Their valuing the crusade confers instrumental value on the evils they are crusading against, and yet they cannot acknowledge this, because their crusade consists in implacable opposition to those evils.

Again, you do not have to leave the movie theater to recognize this. The hero is ennobled and (frequently) redeemed by his heroism. The villain enabled the heroism. But the hero cannot acknowledge this, because to acknowledge it is to see some good in villainy, and his heroism consists in implacable opposition to villainy. Hence the hero manifests a kind of myopic ingratitude. Rather than blowing the villain to pieces with a parting taunt, the hero should be blowing the villain to pieces with a murmur of thanks.

"On Not Being Sorry for the Morally Bad" concerns agent-centered permission and our affective attitudes. Moral philosophers have paid a great deal of attention to agent-centered permission in action. When does morality permit us to serve our own interests by bringing about states of affairs that are, on balance, bad, impartially considered? But they have paid much less attention to agent-centered permissions in desire and emotion. When does morality permit us to be glad that on-balance-bad things have happened, sad that on-balance-good things have happened?

One answer: it is permissible to be glad or sad in whatever way you like. Moral impermissibility pertains to what we do, not to what we desire and feel.

Smilansky rejects this answer. It is not permissible to be glad that a ship filled with old Buddhists sank, and they all drowned. Even if you owe your existence to the Holocaust (in the sense that you would never have been born had the Holocaust not occurred), it is not permissible to be glad that the Holocaust occurred.

Another answer: it is permissible for me to be glad that a bad thing happened if and only if, if I had somehow been in a position to bring it about that the bad thing happen, it would have been permissible for me to do so.

Smilansky rejects this answer too. Suppose (I am liberally paraphrasing here) that a busload of racist thugs is heading towards a cliff, and suppose that you are one of those people the thugs despise. Is it permissible for you to help the bus over, on the grounds that it is full of racists? No. They are racists, but they do not deserve a fiery death. Now suppose you can stop the bus at no cost or danger to yourself (by lowering a barrier, say). Is it permissible for you to refrain from stopping the bus, on the grounds that it is full of racists? No. Now suppose that the bus falls over the cliff before you had a chance to stop it. Is it permissible for you to be glad that the bus fell off the cliff, on the grounds that it was full of racists? Yes, says Smilansky. It is morally permissible to take joy in events that it would have been morally impermissible to bring about.

Again, Smilansky is getting at something real and interesting here. What we call 'poetic justice' is often highly disproportionate to the offense, highly unjust, and yet we feel licensed to take pleasure in it. You may wonder whether this is a grubby feature of folk morality that will wither under the blazing light of moral reflection, or something deep and resilient. No matter. By prompting the question Smilansky has performed a service.

And the same holds for the rest of his book. It prompts interesting questions.