Ten Philosophical Essays in the Christian Tradition

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Frederick J. Crosson, Ten Philosophical Essays in the Christian Tradition, Michael J. Crowe and Nicholas Ayo (eds.), University of Notre Dame Press, 2015, 279pp., $35.00 (pbk) , ISBN 9780268023119.

Reviewed by Walter Nicgorski, University of Notre Dame


These ten of his many essays were selected by Frederick J. Crosson in 2008 for presentation in a book such as this. All but one of them had appeared earlier in appropriate journals and collections. While they were being prepared as a single manuscript, Crosson suffered a fall that resulted in brain injuries which led to his death late in 2009. His colleagues and friends of many years, Michael J. Crowe and Nicholas Ayo, took up the editorial tasks to bring Crosson's manuscript through publication. The extent of the debt of current and future readers for the initiative and efforts of Crowe and Ayo is known only when one is drawn into the significant and wide-ranging thinking displayed in the book. Crosson's work represents a major achievement at both distinguishing and integrating Christian faith and reason. It is an important contribution to philosophy and theology, enriched by his probing and fair-minded deliberateness and devotion to reading and education in the "greats." Crosson instantiates in his writing a broad and rich sense of the quest for wisdom. As one of his colleagues in Notre Dame's Philosophy Department once remarked, Crosson's contribution to philosophy is "not widely known nor easily forgotten."

The editors have enhanced this book by inviting Mary Katherine Tillman to write a tribute to Crosson, and Mark Moes to provide an introduction. The reader will also be grateful for the book's list of Crosson's major publications and its detailed general index. The essays of Tillman and Moes help to engage the reader by highlighting certain themes and characteristics in Crosson's essays. Moes at several points indicates resources in the work of other scholars for appreciating and developing Crosson's thinking. It is important to remain aware that the ordering of the essays is the work of Crosson himself. He chose these essays from more than forty-five which he had published and made the decision to include the previously unpublished essay on Cicero's philosophy of religion. Whether intended or not, what was included and the order of the essays provide a remarkable self-revelation of not only the working of his mind but also where his affections were and how the two worked in tandem in his life.

Crosson's essays can be said to fall in the academic fields of philosophy of religion and political philosophy. Those might seem an unlikely combination constituting the sphere of his interests and the foci of his search for wisdom. Yet in working in that sphere Crosson brings out some fascinating points of contact and interaction. The ordering of the essays reveals to readers his thinking on the ways of approaching the central issues in those academic fields and, perhaps, something of his own method or rhetoric in presenting his thinking.

Most important among the points of interaction is religiousness as a fundamental reality of human nature and therefore a primary topic for political philosophy. Crosson appears to be affirming such views throughout the book. They are built on his distinction between religion over against theology, natural as well as confessional or revelation-centered. Cicero's understanding of religion has an important role in essays that originally appeared before the Cicero chapter which makes its first appearance here. In the second chapter, which is largely on Augustine's uncovering the role of Providence in his life, Crosson observes, "But Augustine, like Cicero, thinks of religion as the offering of prayers and sacrifices to a superior being called divine, and the seeking of his help in making one's way" (51-52). Later on in the collection the reader can see this understanding laid out directly in the name of Cicero: "For Cicero the questions about the existence and nature of the gods arise out of practices which he finds in his world . . . " (99). "But the philosophy of religion, for Cicero, arises not from reflection on the abstract question of whether anything divine exists but from reflection" on such practices represented in rituals and divination in his time (107). Putting the distinction in concrete terms, Crosson will later say "Aristotle's conception of a divine unmoved mover was intellectually breathtaking but inaccessible to religion," adding "the Stoics came closest to making philosophy and religion compatible" and "deserved the greater attention which Cicero gave to them" (130).

That compatibility seems to be the key to Crosson's interpretation of the often perplexing end of Cicero's dialogue, De Natura Deorum. Crosson sees Cicero along the way of the dialogue raising valid questions about the truth of Stoicism but in the end and for himself as a pontiff and good Roman citizen he finds something like Stoicism the best available explanation of practices that should entail human freedom and responsibility. So it is that religious practices require a god or gods of a certain kind or nature (natura deorum). In order that such practices be healthy and capable of sound defenses, they are usually a matter of political concern and supervision. Even today policy makers and our courts must confront the questions of what constitutes religion and what are the limits of religious liberty.

What is suggested in Cicero's definition of religion and his choice to make philosophy reflect on practices comes, in Crosson's view, into clearer light when Christianity "metamorphosed the relation between religious belief and natural reason, between faith and philosophy" (130). It is that new relationship, as actually experienced, that keenly interests Crosson and that is a dominant topic running through these essays. What more can be said, in the confines of this review, on this central concern and other important topics of the collection can at best be highlighted by taking up the order of the essays and how this reveals Crosson's thinking.

The very first essay shows Crosson addressing the methodology that should guide his and our necessarily careful inquiries into significant texts. Crosson had encountered, likely as a student of political thought, the influential writings of Leo Strauss on esoteric writing in the tradition of Western literature on politics, religion and philosophy. Crosson puts first in his collection what was likely a fruit of his most advanced thinking about hidden and multiple meanings in the written work of great minds. This powerful essay ("Esoteric versus Latent Teaching") distinguishes esoteric writing from that in texts such as the Scriptures and Augustine's Confessions where multiple levels of meaning, latent meanings, can be found and call out for understanding. Crosson likely discovered the distinction in his earlier work on texts and now in this collection shows his use of it in closely analyzing several texts of Augustine as well as in his reading of Cicero, John Henry Newman and Hume. This distinction in the kinds of writings is sharp for Crosson as his distinctions tend to be (distinguendum est), and because it is posed largely between pre-Christian and post-Christian writers it is overall persuasive. One wonders, however, whether the classical uses of imagery and myth (e.g. Plato's cave and sun) are more in the vein of latent meaning, truths presented to be accessible to different capacities to understand rather than as esoteric teachings, deceptions to protect the teacher and/or the community.

As becomes clear in the second essay ("The Disclosure of Hidden Providence"), the latent meaning of a text or, especially in this instance, of aspects of the life of Augustine become accessible with the eyes of Christian, perhaps even Biblical, faith and practice. One is assisted through faith, as Augustine himself is, to notice the latent presence of Providence not only in what we are reading but also in the very meaning of events in our lives. Both realities are in need of interpretation to find the truth for us anchored in the larger Truth of all that is and will be. It is Crosson who has led us to the language of "we" and "us." In the very important fourth essay ("Philosophy and Belief"), the last before the Cicero essay, Crosson explicats an autobiographical passage in Augustine's De utilitate credenda which appeared five years before the Confessions. Crosson recounts "Augustine's view" that Christ as historical human being "is not a teacher because he does not show us that what he says is true -- because he cannot" (86). To this, Crosson in apparently Augustine's and his own voice adds, now with my italics: "We have to simply believe Him." In the few pages that follow but not otherwise in this essay or the volume, first person plural usage continues. I am grateful that there was no editorial decision to find Crosson's usage here a lapse because it was thought uncharacteristic or inappropriate in some way. Rather it can be seen as a revealing moment, revealing Crosson's profound identification with Augustine and his journey of reason and faith, revealing too of Crosson's intent to draw the suitably graced reader within that bond of vertical friendship, and finally revealing of the importance of the communal dimension of Augustine's conversion and return to the faith of his mother.

In his essay comparing the accounts of conversion of Newman's Apologia with that of Augustine, Crosson highlights the greater importance to Augustine of the role of friends, family and community. This is a sign of the presence of the Catholic Church throughout the essays; Crosson appears to appreciate, even to identify with, the instances where Augustine points to the Catholic Church as mediator and sustainer in the journey back to God.

The last three essays find Crosson engaging primarily modern and contemporary thought, though each is readily seen as following from the primary themes of the first half of the collection. As in the case of Cicero, Crosson's essay on Hume considers the whole of his writings on religion while coming to focus on a single most important work, which is a dialogue. Crosson's main interpretive challenge here is focused on Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. Though Hume seriously engaged Cicero's De Natura Deorum among other Ciceronian texts and could be said to be half indebted to him, Crosson's essay brings out that Hume's view is starkly different from Cicero's guarded respect for human religiosity. Religious experience is unnatural for Hume; it is a product of fear rather than a sign of connection with some transcendent being. In Crosson's view Hume brings about "a turn" in the philosophy of religion, a turn directing students of religiosity over time toward Feuerbach, Marx and Nietzsche in the quest for understanding.

The second to last essay can be seen as akin to the Hume essay in also being a reflection on the loss of an eternal ground in favor of probing the subjectivities welling up from individual souls. Crosson's essay on "Religion and Natural Law" traces "the appeal to nature" from its origins in Greek thought and Jewish thought's lack of a term for nature, into the medieval and even earlier periods' use of the language of natural law that later gives way to the modern dominance of the discourse of natural rights. Crosson's chapter reflects again the impact of Strauss on this thinking. His contribution is both more and less than what can be taken from Strauss's modern classic, Natural Right and History. It is obviously less in that it is but a chapter-long sketch of what Strauss elaborates in a book. It is more in that it folds into his diagnosis of the failed basis of natural law in modernity Crosson's important work on Mill (Interpretation, 16:2, Winter, 1988/89). And it is critically more than what Strauss presents in that it reflects more fully on the significance of the Catholic Church in carrying the notion of nature as norm to our day. Crosson observes,

For the tradition of natural law was a product of the religious teaching about creation and the Creator. And the notion of nature, of an unchanging objective norm for the guidance of our lives, was in fact carried to us over the centuries in the Church's self-understanding, in its teaching and reflection on its faith (195).

In the unfolding of this chapter on natural law, Crosson's sharpness in distinguishing again appears, and in this respect he can be said to be in company with Strauss. For this reviewer there is more to be said for the continuities between a genuine embrace of natural law language by Cicero and his fidelity to "the appeal to nature" in the Greek "greats" who were Cicero's primary teachers. Also in the larger picture of Western thought about nature there is more to be said for the continuity between the medieval heyday of natural law discourse and the modern appeal to natural rights.

Yet Crosson is clearly right in his concern whether our Western societies have lost the basis for any meaningful appeal to nature and thus lost the basis for "rational argument" in conducting public discourse. He closes this penultimate essay with the simple sentence: "The crucial question for man is whether he is related to something unchanging and eternal" (195).

This same concern is at the forefront when Crosson turns in the final essay ("Reflections on a Century of Catholic Social Teaching") to the social and political teaching of the Church since Rerum Novarum (1891) and the operations and self-understanding of contemporary American democracy. The occasion for Crosson's writing this paper was a 100th anniversary celebration of the School of Philosophy at the Catholic University of America. Those 100 years largely embrace the Church's entrance into engagement with modern democracy and the unfolding of its teaching in reference to Rerum Novarum. Crosson is here focused on the efforts of the Church to be a teacher and inspiration for modern democracy. He is especially but not exclusively concerned with the capacity of American democracy to be receptive to a teaching about economic justice and with the inclination of modernity to think that economic interdependence will suffice for strengthening the moral community that must be at the foundation of our political societies, national and international. Crosson engages thinkers like John A. Ryan and Jacques Maritain who have sought to reconcile modern and American democracy with Catholic teachings. He gives special attention to John Courtney Murray's efforts and worries openly about his mere emphasis on rights and public order just as Crosson is also concerned with the appearance of rights language in Church documents. He gives a bit of reassurance in reporting that Murray in a personal response to him (252, n. 25) shared Crosson's own doubts about the adequacy of freedom as an end of political community. He leaves us with the hope, which so much of his work sought to encourage, that there might be a basis in modern public arenas for the sparks of conscience the Church has been striving to strike.